Reasoning: A Social Picture

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Anthony Simon Laden, Reasoning: A Social Picture, Oxford University Press, 2012, 283pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199606191.

Reviewed by Titus Stahl, Goethe University Frankfurt


According to a familiar picture, "reasoning" is the name of an activity that primarily involves the exchange and critical evaluation of considerations ("reasons") and which aims at rationally motivated agreement about conclusions. On such an account, "reasoning" can be usefully contrasted with "mere conversation," which is unstructured, undirected, and may involve the introduction of different experiences and standpoints without any attempt to establish one particular position as the best justified. Given this reasoning-conversation distinction, it is unsurprising that philosophers have mostly privileged reasoning over the seemingly pointless practice of conversation. Yet, in Reasoning: A Social Picture, Anthony Laden argues that we should liberate ourselves from this picture, because it suggests an account of reasoning that is both misleading and a morally and politically unattractive standard for characterizing persons and conversations as reasonable or unreasonable. To support this claim, Laden contrasts what he calls the "standard picture" of reasoning with a "social picture" that understands the ongoing, playful and inconclusive character of casual conversations -- which Laden illustrates with examples from Jane Austen's "Pride and Prejudice" -- as the best starting point for understanding the activity of reasoning.

The book has three main parts. In part one, Laden introduces five central features of his social picture of reasoning. First, the social picture starts from the activity of reasoning, rather than from a substantive account of a "faculty" of reason. Second, it portrays this rational activity as essentially social, because to reason is to issue an invitation to others: an invitation to share a space of reasons with us, and to let our words speak for them. From this perspective, the social picture represents all reasons as "we"-reasons, that is, expressions of possibly shared forms of subjectivity. Third, the activity of reasoning is understood to be ongoing rather than episodic, as it aims at a continuation of conversation rather than at settling issues. Fourth, reasons are seen as having the authority characteristic of invitations rather than the authority of commands. Finally, while the social picture portrays reasoning as an activity that aims at speaking for others, this does not entail an authoritarian relationship. Rather, in reasoning we aim at mutual answerability and attunement.

From these initial premises Laden develops two main consequences in the first part of his text: (1) that we need a new picture of the authority of reasons that is not modeled on the authority of commands or laws, but rather on what he calls the "authority of connection", and (2) an argument for an account of reasoning where ordinary conversation is the general genus of which reasoning is a species. "Conversation", as Laden uses the term, is a potentially endless activity, which can be playful and experimental, and which aims not at establishing the superiority of one of two competing positions, but rather at a connection between persons.

In part two, Laden gives a substantial account of what constitutes reasoning on the social picture by considering the internal norms of three, increasingly more specific forms of conversational activities. First, he considers the norms of conversation as such, which, he argues, commit participants to aiming at mutual intelligibility (at both a semantic and pragmatic level), to an equality of control over the course of the conversation, and to at least a minimum of sincerity.

Second, Laden considers the more specific form of "engaged conversation," which on his account is nothing other than "reasoning". Within this activity, the commitment to intelligibility is strengthened by a commitment to make a conceptual discursive space public, and to issue invitations to others to share such a space. In reasoning there also is a stronger norm of reciprocity, because each of us must allow the considerations brought forward by others to affect our own participation. Finally, reasoning entails norms of good faith, which demand that our invitations to others be sincere. Laden argues that, taken together, these norms characterize what "reasoning" is without additional reference to a special class of considerations called "reasons". We can rather designate a reason as any consideration that could play a role in sustaining this kind of responsive interaction, without it needing to have some kind of authority or bindingness prior to being introduced in such a conversation.

The third and even more specific type of conversation Laden considers is "engaged reasoning". To participate in this type of activity, we must not only be committed to issue genuine invitations, but must also aim at issuing those invitations that allow us and others to actually find common ground in response to shared concerns. Thus, in engaged reasoning, there is a need for an even stronger form of responsiveness than within reasoning in general: namely, engaged reasoning requires us to put forward considerations that we sincerely take as encouraging or allowing a potential or actual "plural subject" to emerge. Thus, we must be responsive to other reasoners not only in the general sense of being willing to be affected by what they say, but also in the stronger sense of being disposed to take their reaction to our invitations as grounds for changing our own position in the public space of reasons.

Having provided this conversational account of reasoning, Laden uses the third part of his book to provide an account of how his description of the activity of reasoning can lead to the concept of a reason. Specifically, what turns considerations into reasons is that they can be both offered within a reasoning activity and serve to continue this activity. Thus, the invitations to share some space of reasons that make up "engaged conversation" or "engaged reasoning" are only treated as reasons if a rejection of them is compatible with further reasoning. Laden rejects all foundationalist accounts of what reasons are in favor of a forward-looking theory, in which whether some statement constitutes a reason depends on how it is treated after being offered as one. This strategy, he argues, has the advantage of leaving open what reasons are and thus allowing new kinds of reasons to emerge.

In this context, he repeatedly returns to two further features of reasoning. First, he devotes considerable attention to a possible kind of reasoning that refers to the unity of one's self. In such cases, Laden argues, we cannot accept as reasons considerations that force us to submit one part of our psyche to the dictatorial rule of another aspect of our identity, because this closes off a possible source of criticism and thus, in a sense, inhibits reasoning. Second, Laden expands on his earlier conception of "plural subjects" by arguing for a Hegelian conception of reasons that understands all reasons in terms of the plural subjects of which we are part.

As this summary shows, Laden's argument is extremely rich in content and introduces a wide range of novel arguments, making this book not only one of the most interesting recent additions to the literature about social conceptions of rationality, but also genuinely enjoyable to read. If we, as Laden urges us, understand the activity of reasoning not as an unavoidable necessity of social life, but rather as the opportunity to create new forms of community, to forge of new spaces of reasons, and to explore potentially shared standpoints, then we will inescapably discover aspects and possibilities of reasoning that are obscured by standard individualist accounts of rationality.

While many points of Laden's discussion deserve further mention, I will provide more detailed discussion of just three features of his social picture. These concern the ongoing character of reasoning, the account of authority and the relation between the activity of reasoning and the concept of a reason.

(A) Reasoning as ongoing

One central feature of the social picture is that it conceives of reasoning as an ongoing process (24, 84). Reasoning is not necessarily aimed at establishing a conclusion or a decision, nor even -- contrary to Habermas (27) -- at generating agreement, but only at the continuation of reasoning itself. Hence, in Laden's view, reasoning shares the open-ended character of conversation and can be ongoing without thereby being considered to have failed (196). This is a surprising claim. Intuitively, it does seem that the very point of an exchange about the reasons we share -- which, as Laden agrees, constitutes reasoning (93) -- is to allow us to decide what these reasons are reasons for. On Laden's view however, the activity of deciding, even though it may be an outcome of the process of reasoning, is not part of the activity itself (37, 185).

But why draw such a sharp line between reasons and decisions? A collective decision could be analyzed, for example, as a shared commitment to the effect that some issue is to be considered as settled, and to a (usually defeasible) second-order reason to not reopen the question by introducing new considerations. A decision therefore could be described as the acceptance of a reason. But it is unclear why such a decision should then not be counted as a part of the reasoning process itself.

As additional support for this categorical distinction between reasoning and deciding, Laden introduces the Kantian idea that reason cannot close itself off from criticism. He argues that this excludes an understanding of reasoning as settling a given issue, because settled issues are no longer subject to revision. While Laden acknowledges that we can accommodate Kant's critical impulse by understanding decisions as defeasible terminations of reasoning, he also argues that we can (and should) give an even "more robust reading" (27) of the Kantian thesis by interpreting reasoning as not merely revisable but interminable, since "declaring that we have come to an end of reasoning is not a move that is authorized within the activity itself" (76).

Yet it remains unclear why exactly the Kantian intuition is supposed to demand more than revisability. Why is a picture of reasoning that potentially allows all reasons to be overruled not critical enough? Moreover, an understanding of reasoning that does not authorize decisions as moves within its own game might actually undermine the prospects of critique. If reasoning only commits us to participate in an indeterminate process of further working out the consequences of our reasons -- and not a decision about what they are reasons for -- we might lose track of why we need to be critical about reasons at all.

The ongoing character of reasoning becomes more salient, however, if we consider not the first-order activity of determining what reasons we have to perform some action or believe some proposition, but rather the second-order activity of determining the general principles or considerations that delineate the sphere of reasons we potentially share. This second-order activity of reasoning about reasons, which establishes community by making new potential ways of reasoning on the first-level available to us, indeed never comes to any natural end, because there just cannot be any reason on this same level for ending our conversation about shared principles of reason. But the same inference does not hold true for the first-level activity of reasoning. If we understand the ongoing character of reasoning as description of an additional, usually neglected second-order aspect of reasoning, the case for the interminability of reasoning becomes much more plausible.

(B) Authority

The same worry also arises in respect to Laden's treatment of the authority involved in reasoning. He assumes that previous accounts of reasoning have not adequately distinguished between the authority of commands and what he calls the "authority of connection". An authoritative command is an exercise of the ability to alter the normative environment of others independently of their contemporaneous agreement (although this ability might itself be constituted by their prior agreement, 64). By contrast, the authority of connection is the ability to call for responses which constitutively depend on being acknowledged; in Laden's words, "Authority in such a relationship is only eventually constructed when all come to agreement" (67). Thus, attributions of commanding authority always look backwards to an already established authority, while ascriptions of authority of connection -- like invitations -- look forward, because their force depends on acceptance by other participants, or at least on an appropriate response.

However, this distinction invites the question whether the weak form of authority entailed by connection is any authority at all: The claim of reasons to have authority must be at least to some degree success-independent, otherwise it would be hard to see how reasons would be authoritative (rather than causally effective). It also seems to me that we often do more in reasoning than merely "inviting" others to a certain kind of response. Asking for justification of their proposals or actions from others and subjecting their reasons to critique is, very often, not just an invitation but a demand: we claim to deserve being given reasons. This critical force seems to be in danger if the considerations we bring forward when reasoning are interpreted as having no authority independently of their uptake.

(C) Reasoning and reasons

A third issue concerns Laden's strategy of describing the activity of reasoning without relying on a substantive concept of a reason. Instead of first working out what kinds of reasons we can have and then using this as a criterion to decide when an interaction is reasoning, Laden proposes to consider which responses to invitations allow us to continue to reason with each other (206). Although this strategy will not give us a theory about reasons, it will at least tell us what moves in the game of reasoning are in principle legitimate. This approach, Laden argues, avoids the search for an "unconditioned ground of reason" (214), which, for example, Kant and his followers are engaged in.

However, while there may be good arguments for rejecting foundationalism about reasons, I am skeptical that we can characterize the activity of reasoning without employing the concept of a valid reason. As Laden argues, one of the considerations that we can legitimately use in deciding whether to accept an invitation is whether this invitation conflicts with a feature of our shared space of reasons (206). However, the mere fact that you and I currently share a space of reasons need not give me a reason to remain within this space. If some of my commitments in this space conflict with each other, I might want to demand a further justification for why I should remain committed to share this specific space of reasons with you (230).

In response to this problem, Laden proposes a "Hegelian solution": The question as to which spaces of reasons we should share must be answered by evaluating considerations from the different social standpoints we occupy as members of identity-constitutive social institutions (235). But if we can guide our common reasoning by bringing up considerations that are made authoritative by our shared institutions, do we not then have a theory of the grounds of reasons? I am not yet convinced that we can avoid falling back on the concept of a valid reason at the level at which we reason about decisions.

Laden successfully establishes that, as far as the concept of a reason refers to grounds that are themselves socially instituted, we are unable to use the idea of a good reason as a standard external to the activity of instituting such grounds. Rather, we only have internal standards for guiding this activity, grounded in our social life itself. In this respect, Laden's discussion makes a convincing case for the social picture. He presents powerful arguments for a perspective that does not ignore the multiple purposes that reasoning serves in our social life, and that emphasizes in particular the capacity of activity of reasoning to enable new forms of community and to create new principles of shared reasoning.

In any case, these few remarks do not even superficially touch most of the exciting arguments to be found in Laden's book. As it combines a great number of challenging ideas with an extraordinarily clear line of argument, it certainly will play a major role in the discussion of social theories of reasoning and deliberation. It is an important contribution which will put a number of questions on the philosophical agenda for some time to come.