Reasoning in Biological Discoveries: Essays on Mechanisms, Interfield Relations, and Anomaly Resolution

Placeholder book cover

Lindley Darden, Reasoning in Biological Discoveries: Essays on Mechanisms, Interfield Relations, and Anomaly Resolution, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 346pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780521858878.

Reviewed by Roberta L. Millstein, University of California, Davis


Some collections of essays are just that -- collections of essays with little or no connection to one another, with only an introduction or conclusion to attempt to find (or forge) a common theme.  So, it is refreshing to read a collection of essays that not only coheres, but also puts forth a substantial research program.  Such is Lindley Darden's Reasoning in Biological Discoveries: Essays on Mechanisms, Interfield Relations, and Anomaly Resolution.  It is an exploration of "discovery" in biology -- "discovery" as in the oft-used phrase, "context of discovery."  Darden contends that too many philosophers of science have bought into a "simplistic dichotomy," seeing the discovery of hypotheses as irrational (the result of dreams, flights of fancy, etc.), but the justification of hypotheses as rational.  Of course, post-Kuhn, many philosophers of science have sought to blur this distinction, believing that justification may be influenced by many of the same elements as discovery (socio-cultural, psychological, and religious elements in particular).  But Darden's point here is a different one; rather than taking the view that justification is like discovery, she argues that discovery is like justification.  Thus, she insists that discovery can be a rational process.  If this view is correct, discovery ought to be amenable to philosophical analysis, creating a burden for philosophers of science to shoulder.  And shouldering this burden is the aim of Darden's book.  Making liberal and productive use of historical and contemporary case studies from areas of biology such as molecular biology, genetics, and evolutionary biology, Darden seeks to describe discovery in biology through the construction, evaluation, and revision of mechanisms, through relations among different fields, and more.  Her self-stated goal is to be neither purely descriptive, nor prescriptive, but rather "advisory," i.e., potentially useful to historians and philosophers of science interested in reasoning processes involved in scientific discovery, to scientists and science educators, and to builders of computational systems for biological discovery.  Although I don't agree with everything in the book -- and I have some questions about the scope of its claims, as I will describe below -- I do believe that the book largely succeeds in its goals, and, perhaps more importantly, that it represents a novel and important approach to a topic that has received insufficient attention in the philosophical literature.

Darden's book contains twelve essays, some authored by Darden alone and some co-authored, divided into three parts.  Two of the essays are new to this volume; the rest have been published elsewhere, spanning a period from 1977 to 2005.  Figures and tables have all been redrawn.

Part 1: Biological Mechanisms

Chapter 1, an essay that Darden co-authored with Peter Machamer and Carl Craver (hereafter, MDC), constitutes the backbone of Part 1.  In this chapter, MDC describe and defend their account of mechanisms; mechanisms, on the MDC view, are "entities and activities organized such that they are productive of regular changes from start or set-up to finish or termination conditions" (p. 14; emphasis added).[1]  Each aspect of this definition receives further elaboration within the chapter; subsequent chapters in Part 1 elaborate on this characterization (e.g., in Chapter 2, by stressing that mechanisms exhibit productive continuity, without gaps).  These chapters also seek to fulfill MDC's promissory note, namely: "Thinking about mechanisms provides a descriptively adequate way of talking about science and science discovery … [and] presages new ways to handle some important philosophical concepts and problems."  Chapters 2 and 3 (both co-authored with Craver) show how mechanisms illuminate discovery within a field and between fields.  For example, on the MDC account of mechanisms, "entities often must be appropriately located, structured, and oriented, and the activities in which they engage must have a temporal order, rate, and duration" (p. 15); Darden and Craver argue that each of these spatial and temporal aspects of a mechanism constrains and guides the discovery process.  (As they clarify, "the product [in this case, the mechanism] shapes the process of discovery" (p. 47).)  Or, the fact that mechanisms require productive continuity can guide us to fill in missing gaps in our present understanding of the mechanism by "chaining" forward or "chaining" backward.  Chapter 4 (singly authored) takes a slightly different tack, arguing persuasively that Mendelian genetics has neither been reduced to molecular biology nor replaced by it, but rather that Mendelian genetics and molecular biology are fields that investigate mechanisms composed of different entities of different sizes operating at different times.  It is a compelling contribution to a long-standing debate in the philosophy of biology.

There is no doubt that in these chapters Darden and the co-authors are highlighting significant aspects of some scientific practice.  Nonetheless, some questions remain.  Elsewhere, Robert Skipper and I argue that MDC's particular account of "mechanism" does not fit the mechanism of natural selection (Skipper and Millstein 2005),[2] contra Darden's assertion that natural selection is a mechanism (p. 263 and p. 284; but on p. 186 she refers to it as a process).  Thus, it remains to be seen just how universal the MDC account of mechanisms is (and by extension, all the philosophical analyses that depend on that account); Darden and Craver assert, "Many (perhaps most) of the important discoveries in the biological sciences have been discoveries of mechanisms" (p. 93).[3]  In large part, this question arises because of the case study approach (i.e., generalizations from case studies) that Darden has taken.  I consider the book's detailed case studies from a number of areas in biology to be one of its strengths, both because the characterizations of the cases are themselves important contributions to the history and philosophy of biology and because Darden's close attention to the cases make it all the more likely that her philosophical account will be descriptively accurate and relevant to the practice of science.  Nonetheless, what is a strength is also a weakness; only so many cases can be presented in the space of a book, and it is simply unclear how extrapolatable they are to, for example, ecology or paleobiology.  Now, it needn't be a problem if not all biological phenomena (and the discovery of those phenomena) can be characterized in terms of the MDC account of mechanism; it only becomes a problem if we inappropriately try to stuff them into a box that is not the right size or shape.  Indeed, it might be interesting to explore what a larger box (i.e., a looser, more generalizable account of mechanisms), or multiple boxes (an account that included both mechanistic and non-mechanistic phenomena and models) might look like.

Part 2: Reasoning Strategies: Relating Fields, Resolving Anomalies

The essays in Part 2 were all written prior to the essays in Part 1, and thus contain little or no mention of mechanisms; Darden brings the themes of Parts 1 and 2 together in Part 3.  Here again, Darden seeks to explore and clarify issues that have received insufficient attention from philosophers of science.  Chapter 5, co-authored with Nancy Maull, focuses on the interrelations between fields -- in particular, the theories ("interfield theories") that are constructed to elucidate relations between fields.  This shows, Darden and Maull argue, that not all interfield relations are reductions; more strongly, they claim, interfield theories provide evidence for a type of scientific unity as well as scientific progress.  Chapters 6 and 7 (singly authored) extend some of these same themes.  The former argues for the role of interfield theories (and not just analogies) in theory construction.  The latter argues that the synthetic theory of evolution is multilevel (gene level, chromosome level, population level, species level) and multifield (Mendelian genetics, cytology, population genetics and ecological genetics, speciation).  Darden asserts that a "causal relation exists among the mechanisms studied by the separate fields of the synthetic theory" (p. 179).  This claim is interesting in light of her later account of mechanism (discussed in Part 1), for again, while these separate fields may indeed study mechanisms, it is not clear that they all study mechanisms in the MDC sense of the term.  Chapter 8, co-authored with Joseph A. Cain, aims to provide an abstract characterization for selection that can be instantiated for natural selection, clonal selection, and neuronal selection, and to show that such abstract characterizations can be the means through which arguments by analogy for new theories can be carried out (thus returning to some of the themes of Chapter 6).  In short, Chapters 5-8 provide us with a thorough accounting of the relations between fields and their roles in biological practice.

Chapters 9-11 bring the role of anomalies in biology (especially anomaly resolution) to the fore.  In Chapter 9, Darden describes strategies for achieving anomaly resolution, and, more provocatively, proposes implementing these strategies in an artificial intelligence computer program, effectively turning philosophy of science (in this case, methodology) into an experimental science.  This chapter also introduces a distinction between "monster anomalies" and "model anomalies," a distinction that is developed further in Chapter 10.  In Chapter 10, Darden suggests that one form of theory change may occur via abstraction from an exemplar (as I discussed previously, Darden clearly favors case-based reasoning in the philosophy of science -- here she shows that she favors it in science as well), followed by an instantiation of the abstraction.  On Darden's view, exemplars arise from "model anomalies," that is to say, an anomaly that is both "normal" and "typical" -- exemplars that are abnormal ("monster anomalies"), or normal but limited in scope ("special-case anomalies"), are not sources for exemplars.  This tripartite distinction emerges again in Chapter 11 (one of the two chapters that was newly written for the book), where Darden's focus is on clarifying the debates over directed mutation begun in the late 1980s, a controversy that later evolved into debates over so-called adaptive mutation (i.e., cases where environmental stresses induce an overall increase in mutations, including some that are adaptive, providing the possibility for future adaptation to the environmental stress).  Having written on the early versions of these debates myself (Millstein 1997, Chapter 1), I found Darden's dissection of this very large and technical literature to be extremely clear and insightful.  And while I have no quibbles with Darden's analysis of this particular case, I do have some concerns with her tripartite distinction and thus by extension its role in anomaly resolution and theory change.  My concerns are fourfold: 1) that the distinction between "normal" and "abnormal" anomalies will not hold up; there is a large literature calling into question the use of the term "normal" in biological contexts, yet Darden does not engage with that literature; 2) relatedly, that Darden may be uncritically accepting what may simply be rhetoric on the part of scientists who label certain anomalies as abnormal or rare in order to discount them; 3) that the distinction between "rare" and "typical" is vague (as Darden acknowledges on p. 303), suggesting a continuum rather than discrete categories, which 4) raises the question of the ease of resolving the status of these anomalies.  (John Beatty (1997) discusses the difficulty of resolving what amount to, in his terms, debates over relative significance; Michael Dietrich and Skipper (in press) raise concerns about controversy resolution altogether, given the possibility for what they term "manipulating underdetermination".[4])  Of course, none of this is to say that anomaly resolution isn't important in theory change, but rather, it is to suggest that the situation may be more complex than Darden presents it.  

Part 3: Discovering Mechanisms, Construction, Evaluation, Revision

Part 3 consists only of Chapter 12, a chapter that is longer than the others and is intended to synthesize and extend issues raised throughout the book.  (It is the second of the two chapters newly written for the volume.)

The chapter begins by showing the ways in which Darden and the co-authors have clarified and refined the original MDC account of mechanism -- an account that, Darden asserts, "was not presented as a definition of 'mechanism' to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for the usage of the term in all cases" (p. 273; a similar caveat is made with respect to entities, which are described in terms of features that they "may" have).  Some of these refinements are quite helpful -- for example, the added emphasis on productive continuity (which, as discussed above, plays an important role in Darden's view of mechanism discovery) and the relaxation of the MDC account to allow for stochastic mechanisms.  Others are less so; Darden claims that to talk of "A causing B" is a "rather impoverished way of talking compared to describing a mechanism.  'Cause' may point to a mechanism connecting A with B, or it may point to an appropriately bottomed-out specific activity that produces a successor stage B from stage A" (p. 283).  However, since on the MDC account, bottoming out is relative to a particular scientist, research group, or field, it isn't clear that there is a metaphysical difference between a mechanism connecting A with B or a specific activity that produces a successor stage B from stage A, since in the latter case a different scientist, research group, or field might spell out the "activity" in terms of a mechanism.  This suggests that rather than being "impoverished," 'cause' is an appropriately general term.  I don't mean to imply that it isn't often extremely helpful to think in terms of mechanisms, but rather to suggest that mechanisms and causes can be seen as two sides of the same coin.  Furthermore, it casts doubt on Darden's claim that "the analysis of mechanisms here conveniently sidesteps the philosophical enterprise of finding a single analysis of the concept of cause" (p. 283); indeed, Darden's reliance on the concept of "productive continuity" alone casts doubt on that claim.

The bulk of the chapter, however, consists in a detailed analysis of the ways in which her account of mechanisms can yield strategies for construction of hypotheses of mechanisms, strategies for evaluating hypotheses about mechanisms, and strategies for revision of hypotheses about mechanisms.  The chapter, and thus the book as a whole, thoroughly demonstrates the payoff of viewing scientific practice through the lens of a mechanism; indeed, discovery (at least in some cases) needs no longer be seen as a mysterious process, but a rational and comprehensible one.


Thanks to Rob Skipper for helpful comments.


Beatty, John. 1997. Why Do Biologists Argue Like They Do? Philosophy of Science 64 (Proceedings): S432-S443.

Bechtel, William, and Robert C. Richardson. 1993. Discovering Complexity: Decomposition and Localization as Strategies in Scientific Research. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Dietrich, Michael R., and Robert A. Skipper. In press. Manipulating Underdetermination in Scientific Controversy: The Case of the Molecular Clock. Perspectives on Science.

Glennan, Stuart. 1996. Mechanisms and the Nature of Causation. Erkenntnis 44:49-71.

Millstein, Roberta L. 1997. The Chances of Evolution: An Analysis of the Roles of Chance in Microevolution and Macroevolution. Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Minnesota.

Skipper, Robert A., and Roberta L. Millstein. 2005. Thinking about Evolutionary Mechanisms: Natural Selection. Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences 36 (2):327-347.

Wimsatt, William. 1972. Complexity and Organization. In PSA 1972, Proceedings of the Philosophy of Science Association, edited by K. F. Schaffner and R. S. Cohen. Dordrecht: Reidel.

[1] As MDC acknowledge, there are other accounts of mechanisms (e.g., Wimsatt 1972, Bechtel and Richardson 1993, Glennan 1996).  Although these share some commonalities, MDC contend that there are important differences between their account and the others, most notably that theirs is a "dualist" account consisting of both entities and activities, rather than simply processes or simply entities and their properties.

[2] It should be noted that Skipper's and my analysis uses a modified version of the Darden and Cain selection schema (Chapter 8).

[3] The strength of this claim varies, e.g., on p. 1 Darden states that "[b]iologists often seek to discover mechanisms," whereas on p. 47 it is suggested that "there are many different kinds of things to be discovered."

[4] As with Skipper and Millstein's essay (see note 2 above), Dietrich and Skipper's analysis draws on Darden's work -- in this case, her views on theory assessment -- even though it comes to different conclusions than Darden's.  In other words, both essays have their roots in Darden studies.