Reasons and Causes

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Giuseppina D'Oro and Constantine Sandis (eds.), Reasons and Causes: Causalism and Anti-Causalism in the Philosophy of Action, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 239pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230580640.

Reviewed by Andrei A. Buckareff, Marist College


When Donald Davidson's essay, "Actions, Reasons, and Causes," was published, the reigning philosophical orthodoxy with respect to reason-explanations was anti-causalist. Many regarded the explanatory relationship between reasons and actions to be a logical relation. Skepticism about psychologistic proposals that internalized mental states prevailed. What is now almost universally taken to be the standard story of action and its explanation was a minority position and widely regarded as an obviously mistaken view.

The contents of "Actions, Reasons, and Causes" are familiar to many. In it, Davidson refers to explanations of actions by an agent's reasons for action as "rationalizations" (1963/1980a, 3) and defends two main claims about rationalizations. Regarding the first claim (C1), Davidson asserts that a primary reason for action is a belief and pro-attitude pair directed at an action or outcome that satisfies a particular description (1963/1980a, 5). Rationalizations will mention one or both components of a primary reason. The second claim (C2) is about the explanatory role of reasons (1963/1980a, 12). Davidson argues that the relationship between reasons and actions displays the same pattern we discern in causal explanations. If the onset of a primary reason is not a cause of action, we have difficulty accounting for the difference between when an agent has a reason for acting in mind that does not actually explain why she acts as she does and cases where the agent has a reason for acting that does explain why she acts as she does. If we dispense with a causal role for reasons, we may be able to appeal to some reasons of an agent in light of which the action looks reasonable, but, absent a causal role, it is not clear that the putative justification for action explains the action and, hence, really rationalizes it.

With 2013 being the quinquagenary of "Actions, Reasons, and Causes," it is fitting that a book was published with essays that focus on themes in Davidson's essay and related work. In Reasons and Causes there  are essays by both critics and defenders of causalism. But all the authors seem united in their appreciation for Davidson's essay and its impact on work in the philosophy of mind and action over the past fifty years. In what follows, I will discuss the chapters under the headings that it seems most fitting to group them under.

1. How we got here and where we are going

The collection begins with an essay by the editors, Giuseppina D'Oro and Constantine Sandis. They provide a useful history of the debates over reason-explanations of action from the mid-twentieth century to the present. They identify three phases in the recent debates over reason-explanations (8).

In phase one, prior to Davidson's essay, the consensus is anti-causalist. The focus is on methodological issues related to our explanatory practices, and the philosophy of action is regarded as of a piece with the philosophy of social science.

Davidson inaugurates phase two. The consensus is causalist, and philosophy of action is closely aligned with the philosophy of mind. Hence, there is a shift away from a focus on our explanatory practices and towards an emphasis on metaphysical issues, including mental causation.

An anti-causalist backlash is characteristic of the third phase. The Humean conception of reasons with which causalism is often associated comes under scrutiny, and the philosophy of action comes into greater proximity with moral philosophy.

2. Reason-explanations and anomalous monism

In their contributions, Daniel Hutto and John Heil each focus on the relationship between Davidson's account of reason-explanations and anomalous monism (1970/1980b). Hutto focuses on the so-called "qua" problem of mental causation for anomalous monism. He argues that Davidson defended causalism in order to explain the "mysterious connection between reasons and actions" (50). Anomalous monism, then, was adopted as a way for Davidson to make his causalism intelligible in the light of his commitment to understanding the mental in a normative and interpretationalist light. Such a commitment requires taking the mental to be non-reductive.

Hutto claims that Davidson has a response to the standard criticism of anomalous monism, namely, mental events qua mental are epiphenomenal and are only causally efficacious qua physical. Hutto christens this response the "Extension Reply." He argues that the Extension Reply must be read weakly in order for anomalous monism to be viable (50). But a result is that anomalous monism is rendered unfit as a reply to the mysterious connection problem because of the nomological character of causality. Thus, the anomalous monist is faced with an apparent dilemma: either endorse a reductionist metaphysics of mind and give up on the normative character of reason-explanations or give up on causalism. Hutto points to an escape between the horns of the dilemma and suggests that reason-explanations should not be thought of as on par with other types of causal explanations, particularly those offered in the natural sciences (64). He admits, however, that we may finally have to give up on causalism.

While Hutto's essay has many virtues, he blurs the distinction between conceptual and ontological claims. Unfortunately, one finds this sort of thing throughout much of the philosophy of mind and action. While Davidson is not the most lucid writer at times, there are places where he is quite clear about the commitments of anomalous monism and about how we should think about reason-explanations. For instance, Davidson has explicitly stated that he regards the mental as a conceptual category and not an ontological category (1987/2004, 114). Mental concepts cannot be reduced to physical concepts, and the "basic concepts of this vocabulary cannot be reduced, or be related by strict laws, to the vocabularies of the physical sciences" (ibid.). Put in terms of truthmaking, our talk about the mind and our talk about the physical have the same truthmakers; but neither conceptual domain can be reduced to the other.

Heil attempts to rectify some of the common mistakes one finds in discussions of anomalous monism in the literature. He argues that, while many are familiar with Davidson's arguments, "the position he advances has not been well understood" (76). In particular, the standard challenges to Davidson's anomalous monism from the problem of mental causation have been misplaced. Heil writes that, "We have been put off the scent by an unfortunate initial misreading of Davidson" (86). For one, Davidson's theory is not ontologically committed to the existence of properties, be they mental or physical, "at least not when 'property' is given a robust, ontologically serious reading" (87). He goes further to note that Davidson prefers to talk of mental and physical "predicates" and "descriptions," with the term "property" being used in an ontologically deflationary way (88).

As noted above, the mental-physical distinction is merely a conceptual distinction. Ergo, it is not ontologically deep. The supervenience of the mental on the physical should just be understood as the thesis that every event that can be given a mental description can also be given a physical description. The irreducibility of the mental to the physical is simply the thesis that mental descriptions are not reducible to physical descriptions.

Heil commends Davidson's strategy (when properly understood) at the end of his essay. While he does not accept all of the commitments of Davidson's ontology, he suggests the framework Davidson provides for thinking about the metaphysics of mind -- which involves conceptual dualism coupled with ontological monism -- is promising and worth exploring and developing further.

3. Reasons and the explanation of action

The next four chapters focus broadly on the nature of reasons for action and the implications for how we should think about the explanation of action. The first of these is by Brian P. McLaughlin. McLaughlin echoes George Wilson (1989) and others, arguing that rationalizations are not causal explanations because they are irreducibly teleological (108-109). Reasons for which an agent acts are directed at ends and they rationalize actions in virtue of the ends at which they are directed. Additionally, reasons understood as mental states are the wrong sort of things to be causes, according to McLaughlin. They are dispositions, and it is the bases of dispositions, he claims, that are the causes. That said, such explanations are nonetheless causal explanations because the bases that are the "realizers" of the dispositions that we invoke in reason-explanations are causes (103-106).

While he does not acknowledge this, McLaughlin's argument rests on a controversial view about dispositional properties. Many other prominent accounts do not take the directedness of dispositions to be in conflict with dispositions (including those constitutive of mental states) being the causal relata in causal processes and argue against the need for dispositions to have causal bases (see, e.g., Heil 2003 and 2012, and Martin 2007). Further consideration of a proposal like McLaughlin's seems worthwhile. But progress will require bringing the philosophy of mind and action in closer conversation with relevant debates in ontology.

Julia Tanney and Maria Alvarez present anti-psychologistic proposals of reasons for action. Tanney's focus is largely on our language about causation and explanation, with an eye towards dismissing the standard story of reasons that explain our intentional actions as mental items that are causes of those actions. Central to her essay is her argument that our explanations in terms of reasons are often far richer than simple explanations in terms of belief-desire pairs, and they do not exhibit the traits of causal explanations found in the sciences.

Alvarez follows Tanney in her rejection of psychologism about practical reasons, focusing her attention on critiquing the standard causalist commitment to reasons as mental states. Unlike Tanney, Alvarez maintains her silence on the tenability of any version of causalism. This is disappointing since she ends her 2010 book, Kinds of Reasons, leaving the question open about whether we might be able to formulate a viable anti-psychologistic version of causalism. I look forward to Alvarez answering this question in her published work.

Alfred Mele defends causalism by trying to clarify what the causes of actions may be. He argues that even if Davidson was wrong about what reasons for action are, causalism is not untenable (167). He offers up a disjunctive necessary condition for what must be cited in an adequate explanation of an intentional action. He allows for reasons to be understood as objective favorers such as Tanney and Alvarez take them, but he also lists psychological states, their neural realizers, and facts about what an agent believes, desires, etc., to be what may be cited in an adequate explanation (168). Mele ends by revisiting Davidson's challenge to anti-causalists (see the discussion of (C2) above), briefly discussing a recent response by D'Oro (2007).

4. Reason-explanations and folk psychology

The last two chapters are by Scott Sehon and Karsten Stueber. Sehon defends anti-causal teleologism by going on the offensive. He argues that causalism purports to provide an account of the commonsense psychological view of reason-explanations. But causalism and commonsense psychology clash when it comes to the commitments of each regarding the nature of the mind. He argues that, necessarily, if mental states cause behavior, then they are identical with physical states. But it is possible for mental states to exist and not be identical with physical states. So causalism is false.

Suppose Sehon is right that taking mental states to be identical with physical states is an ontological commitment of causalism. Some proponents of causalism will be made uneasy by the thought that their favored theory of action may imply such a commitment. But perhaps causalists should follow Davidson's example and accept this as an ontological commitment of causalism (Buckareff 2012). In any case, an adequate reply to Sehon and those defending views like his demands that causalists think more about the connection between causalism and broader debates over the metaphysics of mind.

Stueber's essay concludes the collection. He offers a unique defense of causalism as the folk-psychological theory of action-explanation that ties causalism to simulation theory. As such, his defense emphasizes the first-person standpoint and our capacity for re-enactive sympathy in our reason-explanations.

The line of defense of causalism provided by Stueber is anticipated in Davidson's work (see 1963/1980a, 8-9; 2004, 115). Stueber explores what we find in Davidson in more depth, arguing that the practice of giving psychological explanations is "tied to our capacity for re-enactive sympathy and the first-person perspective" (211). In particular, from this perspective an agent's actions are rendered intelligible in virtue of the mental states of the agent at the time that are best understood as causally explaining what the agent does.

5. Conclusion

The editors of this volume have put together a fine collection of papers. The chapters are consistently very good. Anyone doing scholarship on Davidson will find much of interest in here (especially the essays by D'Oro and Sandis, Hutto, and Heil). The same is true of philosophers working on mental causation. But this book will be of the most value to philosophers working in action theory, particularly those working on debates over reason-explanations.


Alvarez, M. (2010) Kinds of reasons: an essay in the philosophy of action. New York: Oxford University Press.

Borghini, A. and Williams, N. E. (2008) A dispositional theory of possibility. Dialectica, 62, 21-41.

Buckareff, A. (2012) An action-theoretic problem for intralevel mental causation. Philosophical Issues, 22, 89-105.

Davidson, D. (1963/1980a) Actions, reasons, and causes. In Essays on actions and events (3-19). New York: Oxford University Press.

Davidson, D. (1970/1980b) Mental events. In Essays on actions and events (207-227). New York: Oxford University Press.

Davidson, D. (1987/2004) Problems in the explanation of action. In Problems of rationality (101-116). New York: Oxford University Press.

D'Oro, G. (2007) Two dogmas of contemporary philosophy of action. Journal of the Philosophy of History, 1, 11-26.

Heil, J. (2003) From an ontological point of view. New York: Oxford University Press.

Heil, J. (2012) The universe as we find it. New York: Oxford University Press.

Martin, C. B. (2007) The mind in nature. New York: Oxford University Press.

Wilson, G. M. (1989) The intentionality of human action. Stanford: Stanford University Press.