Reasons and the Good

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Roger Crisp, Reasons and the Good, Oxford University Press, 2006, 178pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199290334.

Reviewed by Chris Heathwood, University of Colorado at Boulder


Roger Crisp's Reasons and the Good defends, in a forthright and amiable style, quite an array of doctrines in metaethics and normative ethics, many of which challenge orthodoxy.  Crisp advances substantial theses about reasons, welfare, pleasure, moral knowledge, intuition, moral disagreement, personal identity, impartiality, population axiology, and more.  While this breadth is impressive, it is to some extent sacrificed for depth in this relatively short book.  There's not enough space in a book of this length to clarify, develop, and defend, in a fully satisfying way, the book's many ideas.  Nonetheless, this bold and sweeping work contains quite a number of provocative discussions of interest to theoretical ethicists of many stripes.

The first, and metaethical, half of the book (chs. 1-3) primarily concerns reasons for action and our knowledge of them.  Chapter 1 explains and defends the radical-sounding claim that "there are no ultimate moral reasons" (71).  In chapter 2, Crisp nevertheless defends realism about normative reasons -- roughly the view that reasons to do one thing rather than another exist and are "not to be understood entirely in terms of, say, human projection or expression," or human graspability, or motivation (45).  He here discusses objections to realism by Williams, Hume, Smith, Blackburn, and Korsgaard.  Crisp also endorses "welfarism about reasons," the view that only facts about welfare provide ultimate reasons (37).  In chapter 3, Crisp outlines and defends an intuitionistic moral epistemology, and in the process articulates an account of intuition (78-79), defends a priori knowledge against objections (especially Benacerraf's problem (85-88)), and addresses the problem of disagreement for moral knowledge (88-97).  Crisp takes the phenomenon of disagreement more seriously than many moral philosophers, charging philosophical ethics with "an unjustified dogmatism or over-confidence" (94).

The second half of the book (chs. 4-6) is in normative ethics, broadly construed.  In chapter 4, Crisp defends two unpopular doctrines: hedonism about well-being (especially against the doctrine of swine and experience machine objections); and a "felt-quality" theory of the nature of pleasure (3).  Chapter 5 argues for what amounts to a theory of personal identity -- "the continuing capacity of consciousness view" (130) -- along with several theses concerning the connection between one's reasons and the welfare of others.  These include "the dual-source view," which says that "the well-being of others can provide one with reasons to act in addition to those provided by one's own well-being" (132), and the impartialist idea that we are not permitted to favor the welfare of those near and dear to us (142-144).  The book's final chapter, on population axiology, criticizes egalitarianism, defending in its place a version of prioritarianism -- "the weighted priority view" -- a "principle that allows us to give priority to the worse off but in giving priority to take into account the size of benefits at stake and the numbers of people who will benefit" (154).  To impress further the breadth of Crisp's book, let me emphasize that this synopsis is by no means complete.

Instead of offering brief comments about a bunch of ideas in the book, I will focus on just two, so that I can interpret and explore them more fully.  The ideas are (1) Crisp's felt-quality theory of the nature of enjoyment and (2) his response to the doctrine of swine objection to hedonism.  In each case, I will try to explain what I take the view to be and why it seems to me not to be fully satisfactory.

(1) The Felt-Quality Theory of Enjoyment

What is pleasure or enjoyment?  Our first thought might be that it is just a certain feeling, one with which we are all intimately acquainted, but the nature of which is simple and unanalyzable, like that of the sensation of red or the feeling of nausea.  So just as the best we can do to call our attention to the sensation of red is to cite its typical causes -- ripe tomatoes, stop signs, etc. -- the best we can do with the feeling of enjoyment is to identify it by means of its typical causes -- basking in the warm sun, chugging an ice-cold lemonade, solving a tough crossword clue, watching an interesting drama unfold.  This is the distinctive feeling view, one type of internalist or felt-quality theory.[1]

The problem with the distinctive feeling view is that phenomenological reflection seems to reveal that, unlike with the sensation of redness and its causes, there is in fact no single, distinctive feeling caused by each of the four enjoyable activities listed above.

Faced with this phenomenological data and the heterogeneity of enjoyable experiences (as illustrated by the four examples above), many theorists conclude that an externalist, attitudinal theory of enjoyment must be correct: what makes each of these experiences enjoyable has nothing to do with any further feelings they cause, but instead with the attitude we take up toward the experiences themselves.  It is the fact that we want, or like, or have some other pro-attitude toward them that make them count as enjoyable.  Unlike on an internalist conception, enjoyableness on this view is an extrinsic and accidental feature of the experiences that have it.

Bucking this trend, Crisp argues against externalist, attitudinal theories (105-107) and endorses an internalist, felt-quality account, but one different from the distinctive feeling view described above.  "Enjoyment," according to Crisp, "is best understood using the determinable-determinate distinction" (109).  What makes the warm feelings we typically get when sunbathing and the cool and sweet feelings we typically get when lemonade-chugging all feelings of enjoyment is that each is a determinate of the determinable enjoyableness.  They are some of the specific, determinate ways a feeling can be enjoyable.  Crisp draws an interesting analogy with color: the colors are all very different from one another -- they form a heterogeneous lot, like the class of enjoyable feelings -- but nonetheless each manages to be a determinate of the same determinable: being colored.  They are the specific, determinate ways an object can be colored.

Crisp's theory is attractive because it respects the phenomenological data cited earlier, but without abandoning internalism, the idea that being enjoyable is an intrinsic property of the experiences that have it.  Internalism is especially compelling when one considers intense pains (we can presume that the sort of theory that is true of pleasure will be true of pain as well).  Imagine the feeling of stepping barefoot on a tack.  Isn't it just part of the very nature of that feeling that it is painful?  It can seem incredible to suppose that this feeling qualifies as painful only due to the attitude that we happen to take up towards it.

Nevertheless, I think Crisp's theory faces some important problems.  Unfortunately, Crisp considers only one (in my view not very compelling) objection to his account of enjoyment (110-111).  Here I'll raise two more:

i. Crisp's theory of enjoyment doesn't actually explain perhaps the most important thing we want a theory of enjoyment to explain -- namely, what makes enjoyable feelings enjoyable, or what enjoyment consists in.  Crisp's theory is that enjoyable feelings are all determinates of the determinable being enjoyable.  But this doesn't answer the question.  We want to know why these feelings (and, relatedly, why these feelings) are determinates of the determinable enjoyableness (this is just a convoluted way of asking why they are enjoyable).  Crisp's view seems to be that it is just a primitive, inexplicable fact that these feelings are the enjoyable feelings.  Insofar as we think this fact is a fact that should be explicable, Crisp's theory is unsatisfying.  Note that the other two theories on the table do provide an explanation here.

Actually, some of Crisp's remarks do suggest a sort of explanation: what makes an enjoyable experience enjoyable is that it feels good (109).  This seems like progress since the issue of what makes feelings that feel good feel good may seem less in need of explanation.  But I think this route (of explaining an experience's being enjoyable in terms of the experience's feeling good) makes the view too touchy-feely, leaving out more cognitive enjoyments.  It might be very enjoyable to watch some drama unfold without it being correct to say that watching the drama unfold "feels good."

Crisp might instead respond to the original objection by appealing again to the analogy with color.  Consider the question, Why is red a color?  I wouldn't be too surprised if this question didn't have an answer, i.e., if it turned out to be a brute fact that red is a color.  And I wouldn't be too unsatisfied either.  Why red is a color isn't something that cries out for an explanation.  Perhaps it's just of the nature of red that it is a color.  Likewise, Crisp might claim, it's just of the nature of the feeling of basking in the sun that it is enjoyable.  Maybe there are never explanations for why some determinate belongs to its determinable.

But the analogy with color seems to break down here.  It continues to seem reasonable to expect an answer to the question, Why is the feeling of basking in the sun enjoyable?  And by contrast it continues to seem foolish to hold out too long for an answer to the question, Why is red a color?  Perhaps this can be made more compelling by focusing on a slightly different pair of questions.  Why are sweet tastes enjoyable while bitter tastes are not?  That seems like a much more worthwhile question than, Why is red a color while triangularity is not?

ii. Crisp's view is a form of internalism.  Internalism can seem more plausible at first glance -- especially if one's first test case is one of intense pain -- but I believe that externalism is the more plausible view upon reflection, after considering a wider variety of cases.

The cases that most clearly support externalism involve sensations that some people like and others don't (especially gustatory sensations), or sensations that bother some people but not others.  The sound of fingernails scratching on a chalkboard is extremely unpleasant to many people, but not at all unpleasant to others.  If unpleasantness is intrinsic to sensations, then one of these groups has to be mistaken.  If this sound really is intrinsically unpleasant, then those whom it doesn't bother and who therefore judge it to be not at all unpleasant, are wrong.  That is hard to swallow.

Another kind of case involves enjoyable sensations we grow tired of after prolonged exposure.  Flowers and perfume initially smell nice, but can begin to nauseate after a while.  One way this may happen is that the sensation itself somehow transforms after prolonged exposure -- you start getting a different smell.  But surely another way this happens is that the smell stays the same while our feelings about it change.  What we once liked, we now dislike.  What was once an enjoyable sensation no longer is.  This is incompatible with internalism about enjoyment since it is a case of change in enjoyability of sensation without an intrinsic change in the sensation.

Internalists could respond by insisting that such cases always involve intrinsic changes in the sensation.  But this seems like a desperate move, akin to the desperate strategies used to defend views like psychological egoism.  To further appreciate the general worry here, imagine a professional wine taster whose job it is to categorize wines along a list of dimensions.  After the hundredth taste of wine, she may no longer get any pleasure from it, but might still retain all her sensitivity and powers of discrimination, and continue to classify the wines correctly.  But if internalism is true, she wouldn't be experiencing the same taste sensations she would have been experiencing had she been enjoying the wine.  She might thus be unable to classify the wines properly.  But that can't be how it works.  Surely she can know what a wine tastes like whether she is enjoying it or not.

(2) The Philosophy of Swine Objection

Crisp understands the philosophy of swine objection to hedonism, famously discussed by Mill, in terms of the following case:

Haydn and the Oyster.  You are a soul in heaven waiting to be allocated a life on Earth.  It is late Friday afternoon, and you watch anxiously as the supply of available lives dwindles.  When your turn comes, the angel in charge offers you a choice between two lives, that of the composer Joseph Haydn and that of an oyster.  Besides composing some wonderful music and influencing the evolution of the symphony, Haydn will meet with success and honour in his own lifetime, be cheerful and popular, travel, and gain much enjoyment from field sports.  The oyster's life is far less exciting.  Though this is rather a sophisticated oyster, its life will consist only of mild sensual pleasure, rather like that experienced by humans when floating very drunk in a warm bath.  When you request the life of Haydn, the angel sighs, 'I'll never get rid of this oyster life.  It's been hanging around for ages.  Look, I'll offer you a special deal.  Haydn will die at the age of seventy-seven.  But I'll make the oyster life as long as you like'.  (112)

The objection implied here isn't exactly Mill's philosophy of swine objection.  Crisp's oyster, like Mill's satisfied swine, gets only lower pleasure, but the oyster's life has an additional unappealing feature that Mill's pig avoids: lack of variety.  And one can run a separate lack-of-variety objection to hedonism that doesn't involve merely porcine pleasures (imagine an arbitrarily long life spent enjoying the same mathematical proof or witty Jane Austen line over and over and over again).  Crisp's case, therefore, seems to run together two importantly distinct objections to hedonism.

In any event, Crisp's reply to Haydn and the Oyster is that no matter how long the angel makes the oyster life, Haydn's life can nevertheless contain more enjoyment.  Not just be better, but actually contain more total enjoyment.  Thus a pure hedonism can deliver the desired result that Haydn's life is better.

Why should we think it possible that Haydn's life contains more pleasure than an arbitrarily long oyster life?  I think this is Crisp's argument.  Crisp appears to hold that normal instances of certain kinds of enjoyable experience (e.g., those involved in reading a great novel) are such that they contain more enjoyment than any instance of certain other kinds of enjoyable experience (e.g., those involved in floating very drunk in a warm bath) no matter the duration of the latter (115).  Why think enjoyment has this sort of lexicality?  Crisp essentially appeals to a Millian competent judges-style test, but one that delivers results about a natural, non-evaluative property.  His claim is that someone acquainted with both sorts of pleasure wouldn't just prefer any instance of the former, higher sort to any instance of the latter, lower sort (Mill might say this), but would judge any instance of the higher sort to contain more enjoyment than any instance of the lower sort (115).  We are to conclude that all instances of higher enjoyment really do contain more enjoyment.

Though I am inclined to doubt it, the idea that value displays lexicality of this sort is an idea worth pursuing.  But I find it just about inconceivable that enjoyment itself -- a natural, psychological quantity -- could be like this.  I don't see that any competent judge who considered the matter carefully would judge this way.  The view also has implications that are difficult to accept.  It implies that the most amazing meal, or massage, or heroin high anyone has ever had is less enjoyable than the enjoyment I will get the next time I hear someone quote Mark Twain.  Crisp would even seem to be committed to the claim that the total amount of enjoyment from all the great meals, massages, and heroin highs that ever have been and ever will be experienced by all the people in all the world, is less than the amount of enjoyment I will get the next time I hear someone quote Mark Twain.

Crisp asks us to

imagine someone who has just drunk a cool glass of lemonade and has also completed her first reading of Jane Austen's Pride and Prejudice.  If we ask her to rank on a scale of enjoyableness the experience of drinking the lemonade against that of reading the novel, … [t]here is nothing to prevent our judge's claiming that it would not matter how long the experience of enjoyable drinking could be prolonged: she would never enjoy it as much as she enjoyed the novel.  (115)

If our judge claimed this, I think charity would require that we understand her as attempting to convey the idea that no matter how long the experience of enjoyable drinking could be prolonged, that experience would never be as important to her, or as good, as the experience of reading the novel.  For if she intended to convey what she literally said, shouldn't we conclude that she was just confused about the concept of enjoyment?

A final point to note is that Crisp's reply doesn't address everything that bothers us about Haydn and the Oyster: it doesn't avoid the lack-of-variety objection I alluded to above.  A life spent enjoying the same higher pleasure over and over again, for millennia, appeals to us much less than does Haydn's seventy-seven-year life, even though the former life would contain far more enjoyment -- even on Crisp's lexical view of enjoyment.


Crisp's book demonstrates facility with an impressive breadth of topics in normative ethics, metaethics, and beyond.  His philosophical ingenuity and knowledgeability come across in every chapter.  However, I believe Crisp's readers would have gotten more out of his book had Crisp allowed himself more space to put his full powers to bear on his topics.[2]


Carson, Thomas L., Value and the Good Life (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 2000).

Feldman, Fred, "Hedonism," in The Encyclopedia of Ethics, L. C. Becker and C. B. Becker (eds.) (New York: Routledge, 2001), pp. 662-669.

Sumner, L. W., Welfare, (Oxford: Happiness, & Ethics Clarendon Press, 1996).

[1] Carson (2000, pp. 13-14) uses 'felt-quality theory' to cover both the distinctive feeling view and the hedonic tone theory, which are so-called in Feldman 2001 (p. 663).  Crisp uses the term 'felt-quality' in a few places to characterize his view (3, 110).  Sumner (1996, pp. 87-91) uses the labels 'internalism' and 'externalism', as does Crisp.  Although Crisp accepts a felt-quality theory but rejects the distinctive feeling view, it's not clear whether he would accept the label 'hedonic tone theory'.

[2] I am grateful to David Barnett, Fred Feldman, and Christian Lee for helpful discussion.