Reasons as Defaults

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John F. Horty, Reasons as Defaults, Oxford University Press, 2012, 256pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199744077.

Reviewed by Richmond H. Thomason, University of Michigan


This book combines foundational issues in moral and practical reasoning with ideas in logic that may still be so new they are unfamiliar to many philosophers.

The text is sufficiently clear and self-contained to serve as an introduction to nonmonotonic logic (or to one approach to it) for readers with a general background in logic, but it is mainly concerned with how to use the logical theory to inform philosophy. The logic itself can be stated fairly simply by postponing complications and technical issues that lurk in the background. Horty seeks to do this by moving most of these to the final chapters and to appendices.

Nonmonotonic logic seeks to deal with premises or axioms that are defeasible or can have exceptions. Logics of this sort have mainly been developed by computer scientists, but this does not affect their philosophical interest or importance. Before so many logicians migrated to computer science, theories of this sort would have been developed by logically minded philosophers, and nonmonotonic logics address central issues in philosophical logic and commonsense reasoning. Horty is one of the few philosophers who participated in the development of these logics.

The main purpose of the book is to trace the origins of reasons (theoretical as well as practical), and to account for how they give rise to conclusions. This, you might think, is the central task of logic, and ought to have been solved in the distant past. But in a nonmonotonic context it's possible to do far more justice to realistic specimens of reasoning, and to make closer contact with substantive philosophical issues. Nonmonotonic logics are relatively new, and shed light on how conflicting and exception-prone bodies of reasons can support conclusions.

Horty begins by explaining "default logic". This version of nonmonotonic logic, due to Raymond Reiter, extends an ordinary first-order theory with a set of "default rules". An "extension" of such a theory is a set of conclusions that consistently maximizes the list of default rules, without bringing in any conclusions that aren't supported by default rules and logic.

Defaults can conflict: for instance, authorities can provide contradictory information, or issue contradictory commands. Reiter's simple example of such a conflict, known as the "Nixon Diamond," represents an important source of complexity in nonmonotonic logic and receives much attention in Horty's book. In this example, it is known (and only known) that Nixon is a Quaker and a Republican. One default says that if Nixon is a Quaker he's a pacifist, another that if he's a Republican he's not a pacifist. The default theory corresponding to the Nixon Diamond has two extensions: one concluding that Nixon is a pacifist, the other that he is not.

Such conflicts render the logical theory of default logic problematic by confounding the notion of logical consequence. Reiter's logic abandons the idea that logical consequence relates a theory to a unique set of conclusions. Instead, it produces a family of alternative conclusion sets -- a set of extensions. (In some anomalous cases this set can even be empty.) There are ways to associate a unique set of consequences with a default theory. A credulous theorist can (perhaps arbitrarily) choose one of these extensions. A skeptical theorist can try to find what is common to these extensions, perhaps by taking the intersection of their conclusions. Horty returns to this issue often, exploring its increasingly complex ramifications.

The outcome of the first chapter is a (provisional) definition of the set of extensions of an ordered default theory, in which the default rules are (partially) ranked according to priority. If, for instance, we were to say that the default "If Nixon is a Quaker he is a pacifist" has priority over the default "If Nixon is a Republican he's not a pacifist," the theory would then have only one extension, corresponding to the conclusion that he's a pacifist.

Here, the weaker default is overridden. This definition determines the underlying logic that Horty uses for the remainder of the book.

In Chapter 2 the book moves from logic to philosophy, motivating and elaborating a close connection between defaults and reasons. Think of a scenario as the set of defaults that are used to build an extension of a default theory. In creating and opting for a scenario (and hence, choosing an extension or set of conclusions), a set of premises (which either belong to the original theory or are concluded as part of the extension) will combine with defaults to form conclusions. Horty wants to identify these premises (relative to default theory and one of its scenarios) as the reasons for the corresponding conclusions. Reasons are the premises of used defaults. With the help of examples, Horty supports and develops this thought, comparing it to similar ideas in the literature. This provides not only an account or analysis of reasons, but, in combination with the theory of logical consequence for defaults, brings into play a theory of how reasons are selected from a competing set of considerations and of how conclusions are drawn from them.

Turning to deontic logic, Chapter 3 is concerned with the derivation of oughts from reasons. Horty exhibits two ways to do this, which correspond roughly to the credulous and skeptical approaches to default reasoning. The first approach traces an ought with content P to the existence of an extension supporting P, and so allows moral conflicts, i.e., cases in which a proposition and its negation are both obligatory. The second approach only admits oughts with content P when P is supported by all extensions, and so produces a body of oughts that is free of moral conflicts.

This is a topic that has received much attention in the philosophical literature. In the course of developing his own account, Horty discusses views of Roderick Chisholm, Gilbert Harman, Mark Schroeder, Earl Conee, Phillipa Foot, Alan Donagan, David Brink, and others. Unlike these other views, Horty's own account is grounded in a logical theory of the underlying reasoning. This is what was provided by the first chapter, which in turn relies on thirty years of work in nonmonotonic logic. It is instructive to see the difference that this makes in the quality of the philosophical discussion, raising it to an entirely new level of clarity.

The discussion of Brink's work (pp. 77-80) illustrates this point well. Horty shows that Brink's account fails to produce the desired conclusions in certain cases. It would be nearly impossible, I think, to have seen this without being able to compare the formal model provided by Horty's theory, and the corresponding model that Horty constructs of Brink's view. The differences between the two theories, and the example that exposes the problem in Brink's account, would emerge from the failure of an attempt to prove the equivalence of the two theories. Alternatively the task of developing a formal theory like Horty's and motivating it properly would involve testing the theory with a suite of counterexamples, which would include the ones that are problematic for Brink's approach. In either case, without the formalization process it would be difficult in areas as complex as these to criticize the theories in the literature with much confidence. The technical work informs and improves the quality of the philosophy.

The advantages of an underlying logical theory can also be seen in the discussion of agglomeration (pp. 89-92) and in the criticisms of Foot's views (pp. 101-102).

The philosophical literature on the closely related topic of moral conflict is also extensive. Horty's careful discussion of this issue in Chapter 4 shows convincingly the failure of arguments against the possibility of such conflicts even in all-things considered oughts. Both the credulous option (which admits moral conflicts) and the skeptical view (which does not) are viable. This discussion sheds light on the philosophical issue, but if the ideas presented in this book are to be extended to deal not just with oughts but also with their role in the reasoning of a practical agent, it may not eliminate closely related problems. (More about this in the conclusion of this review.)

The book now turns to what Horty calls "elaborations" of the basic theory. These include a formal theory that allows priority relations between defaults to be inferred and an examination of Jonathan Dancy's particularist views concerning reasons. Horty argues for a more moderate approach than Dancy's. The discussion exposes unexpected complexity in the issues, and shows remarkable clarity in dealing with this complexity. Again, the formal infrastructure is at work here.

The remainder of the book (except for the appendices, which contain technical material) has to do with complications and problems in the underlying theory that were postponed until this point. Again, logical and philosophical methods are harnessed together and put to work in a way that illuminates both areas. A point that I find particularly interesting is the treatment of skepticism. Just about any philosopher is liable to assume that it's clear what skepticism is, and will proceed immediately to deploy (and usually refute) skeptical arguments. But in fact, the phenomenon of "reinstatement" makes the notion of skepticism problematic. Suppose that as reasoning creatures in an uncertain world, we're forced to rely on defaults.

Skepticism, you'd think, would amount to a refusal to use defaults below some confidence threshold. The problem is that such a refusal may actually enable certain conclusions that would not be forthcoming from a less "skeptical" standpoint. Paradoxically, a skeptic may be forced to believe some things that a nonskeptic might reject.

Before concluding, I want to situate the defaults, reasons and oughts on which Horty's book concentrates in the wider context of a reasoning agent. To have moral and epistemic reasons, an agent will need to obtain defaults. To use these reasons in acting, the agent will need to use them to form goals, plan, and adopt intentions.

First, consider the acquisition of defaults. In an explicit body of regulations, these might be drafted in a legislative process. For an individual, they will have to be learned. But how does this happen? Take the case of epistemic defaults, factual norms about the way things should be, and suppose they are learned as schemata, of the form "If P(x) then Q(x)".

We have a good model of how probabilities are learned, but defaults are not probabilities, even very high probabilities. A model of how defaults are learned should tell us something about how bodies of evidence would support a default scheme, and how they might lead us to reject an entertained default scheme. But what is the difference between evidence that disconfirms such a scheme, and evidence that is simply an exception? I'm not sure that anyone has a good answer to this question, or even the beginnings of a good theory of how defaults would be acquired by a rational agent.

Second, look in the other direction: how would default-derived norms figure in practical deliberation? That is, how would they enter into goal selection, planning, and intention formation? Goals aren't the same as oughts; for one thing, they involve desires, as well as norms.

In some ways, desires are like defaults: standing desires can have exceptions, and desires can conflict. But they would have to interact with epistemic and normative defaults (because goals must be feasible and permissible). I'm sure this interaction is complex because it involves very different sorts of preferences between defaults, and I don't think it's very well understood. Likewise, the formation of subgoals in planning has to be informed by desires and epistemic and normative defaults, and will also involve complex temporal reasoning.

Perhaps the planning process would produce alternative coherent plans of action, in much the same way that systems of defaults produce alternative extensions. But then there would have to be room for rational (or at least, reasoned) choice between these "practical extensions." On the one hand, some of these potential intentions would be preferable to others, and on the other hand, intentions need to be specific and it would not do to simply take what is common to all the alternative plans. (For one thing, this is not likely to even be a coherent plan.) Here, it seems, neither Horty's skeptical nor his credulous alternative is appropriate.

So, in both directions, further complexities are lurking if we wish to extend Horty's ideas. But the beauty of this book is that while at the same time it opens unexpected and challenging complexity in familiar problems, it provides tools to master this complexity with a sense that an outcome of permanent value has been accomplished. In doing so, it takes the philosophy of normative reasoning to a new level, and, I think, provides some hope that this sort of clarity can be preserved even as the scope of the theory is widened.