Reasons for Belief

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Andrew Reisner and Asbjørn Steglich-Petersen (eds.), Reasons for Belief, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 273pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107006874.

Reviewed by Alex Gregory, University of Reading


Reasons are all the rage these days. Philosophers interested in both practical and theoretical normativity have begun to focus on reasons -- reasons for action, reasons for belief -- to a greater degree than at any time before. Where ethicists used to talk about duties and obligations, they now talk about reasons for action, and where epistemologists used to talk about warrants and evidence, they now talk about reasons for belief.

So it is no surprise that Cambridge University Press have published this collection on reasons for belief following their earlier volume on reasons for action (Sobel and Wall 2009). The volume contains twelve papers by various authors on a variety of issues related to the general theme of reasons for belief. The essays are split into two parts: five essays on "Normative Reasons for Belief" and seven on "Reasons and Epistemic Justification". Effectively the first five essays address more abstract issues about the status of reasons for belief -- the "Metaethics" of theoretical normativity -- and the second seven essays address slightly more concrete issues regarding what reasons for belief we actually have.

The book as a whole reads extremely well, and contains many very interesting and insightful essays. Those interested in reasons for belief, or in reasons more generally, should certainly pick up a copy and read those essays on topics they find of interest.

One striking feature of the collection is its breadth. Reasons have taken centre stage in the study of normativity because they seem to be relevant everywhere. But this means that a collection of papers focused on reasons for belief is in one respect not focused at all. This is a virtue in that the book allows one to dip into various areas with which one might not be familiar, and also in that the book allows one to get an overview of the work reasons are doing in different domains. This virtue, however, carries the danger of a vice, which is that the papers fail to fit well together as a collection. Thankfully, this vice is largely avoided: the connections between the papers are often obvious, and one can see various underlying themes recurring throughout the collection.

In what follows I shall very briefly summarise what the essays are about, and then raise some questions about three of them.

The collection opens with an essay by one of the editors, Steglich-Petersen, on "How to be a teleologist about epistemic reasons". Reasons for action seem to connect in some way to considerations of value, and Steglich-Petersen defends the same claim with respect to reasons for belief. Next is a very interesting essay by the other editor, Reisner, on "Is there reason to be theoretically rational?". Reisner argues that there is, arguing that we have reasons to ensure that our beliefs are rational.

The next essay is Veli Mitova's, on "Epistemic motivation: towards a metaethics of belief". Mitova translates some central problems in the theory of motivation over to reasons for belief. The next pair of essays by Jonas Olson ("Error theory and reasons for belief") and Nishi Shah ("Can reasons for belief be debunked?") address whether an error theory about reasons for belief can be sustained. Olson argues yes, Shah argues no. I say more about these papers shortly.

Part II begins with Clayton Littlejohn's essay on "Reasons and the justification of belief". Littlejohn addresses the question of what it is that reasons demand, and argues that the correct answer undermines views according to which evidence or knowledge provide the norms for belief. I say more about this below. Hannah Ginsborg next writes on "Perception, generality and reasons", and argues for a view on which perceptions have conceptual content but of a kind distinct from the conceptual content that beliefs have.

Adam Leite's paper on "Immediate warrant, epistemic responsibility, and Moorean dogmatism" argues that the Moorean response to scepticism fails, because we need to know that we are not deceived in order to know that the appearance of hands justifies us in believing that we have hands. Wedgwood's paper on "Primitively rational belief-forming practices" explores the grounds on which some belief-forming process might be rational even if fallible. Mark Schroeder next writes on "What does it take to 'have' a reason?", in which he assesses the degree to which unjustified beliefs can justify the formation of further beliefs, and suggests some wide-ranging implications of his argument.

Alan Millar writes on "Knowledge and reasons for belief", and argues that perception and testimony provide knowledge in virtue of our applying certain recognitional abilities. Finally, in "What is the swamping problem?", Duncan Prichard neatly explains a central problem for theories that take truth to be the fundamental epistemic value, and suggests that we must reject such views.

I hope this overview of the papers in the collection makes clear both the interest in them and the scope of the ground they cover. In the space I have left I shall make some brief comments about the papers by Olson, Shah, and Littlejohn.

It seems that one possibility regarding reasons for action is the (practical) error theory, according to which all judgements about reasons for action are mistaken. We might think that practical normativity is a myth. Once we recognise this possibility with respect to practical normativity, might we say the same about theoretical normativity? Might the epistemic error theory be true, which says that all judgements about reasons for belief are mistaken?

Olson seeks to defend such a view from objections raised primarily by Cuneo (2007). One such objection comes in the form of a dilemma: an epistemic error theory is either self-defeating or else polemically toothless. It would be self-defeating for defenders of the error theory to claim that there are reasons to believe their view -- for according to the error theory, there are no reasons at all. Olson sensibly denies that there are reasons to believe the error theory, but points out that this does nothing to undermine the claim that the theory is true (83). In saying this, he opts for the other horn of the dilemma, according to which the epistemic error theory is polemically toothless, in the sense that there is no reason to believe it, and so those who deny it are doing nothing wrong.

In response to this objection, Olson points out that those who endorse the error theory can accept that there are non-categorical reasons, which are reasons only relative to some presupposed end or standard of correctness. This allows error theorists to claim that there are non-categorical reasons to believe the error theory. For example, they can claim that if you want to believe the truth, you have reason to believe the error theory (83-5). But here it seems that Olson is sugar coating the view. The very point of the error theory is that there is no real normativity at all. That is why the error theorist must understand such non-categorical "reasons" in a purely descriptive manner. When Olson says that if you want to believe the truth, you have reason to believe the error theory, he really means only that you won't satisfy that desire unless you believe the error theory. If we are good error theorists, we will make this claim whilst also thinking that there is absolutely nothing sensible about such a desire, and more importantly, thinking that there is nothing good or rational about taking the means to satisfy one's desires. So when Olson talks about non-categorical reasons, we should be aware that these are not, by anyone else's lights, reasons. They consist in purely descriptive facts. The error theorist can at best merely describe those who reject the error theory. They are not entitled to say that there is something wrong with such a position. That is the sense in which the view is polemically toothless. The error theory might be true, but error theorists are either insincere or confused if they criticize anyone for failing to believe their theory.

Another objection to the error theory that Olson addresses is that the concept of belief is normative, so that the error theory implausibly entails that there are no beliefs. Olson's response is to appeal to non-categorical reasons again: error theorists can allow that the concept of belief presupposes non-categorical reasons, and so can consistently continue to ascribe beliefs to people. But this is plausible only if it is plausible that the concept of belief implies only non-categorical reasons. This is far from clear. Olson claims that we can capture the normativity of belief by talking about the reasons believers have insofar as they qualify as believers at all. But it seems doubtful that there is any way to specify what a believer is without appealing to the norms governing belief, meaning that Olson's argument simply pushes the problem back a step.

In summary, Olson's paper suggests some relatively promising ways for the error theory to avoid objections, but one wonders whether they are promising enough, and it would be nice to hear more on these issues. In his paper, Shah points out a second problem for error theorists if the concept of belief is normative. The error theory is the conjunction of the claims (1) that normative attitudes are beliefs that ascribe normative properties and (2) that there are no normative properties. But if the concept of belief is normative, as Shah has argued elsewhere (2003), then error theorists cannot allow that there are any beliefs. This is not just intrinsically implausible, but also robs error theorists of the ability to even state their view: if the concept of belief is normative, claim (2) above undermines claim (1). And error theorists cannot simply abandon claim (1) and retreat to claim (2) alone, since non-cognitivists agree with that claim taken by itself, and the error theory is supposed to rival non-cognitivism.

This argument is clever and seems compelling. But it would be nice to hear more about what the error theorist might say in response. Shah's argument relies on the claim that the error theory is defined in terms of the concept of belief. But is this an essential feature of the view, or are there alternative ways of defining the error theory that do not employ the concept of belief? For example, one might think of the error theory as the view that sentences such as "you have a reason to F" ascribe normative properties, and that there are no such properties, or as the view that normative attitudes are not non-cognitive attitudes such as desires or plans, and that there are no normative properties in the world, or as the view that normative attitudes involve ascribing normative properties, but there are no normative properties, and so on. It would be nice to hear more about whether such claims can capture all the error theorist wants to say. I should also note that there might be independent reasons for error theorists to opt for some such formulation of their view. Eliminativism about the mind entails that there are no beliefs, but one would think that eliminativism and the error theory should be consistent, or even happy partners.

I now turn to Littlejohn's paper from the second half of the collection. Littlejohn examines what it is that reasons demand. Should (1) I merely conform to the reasons I have, and perform the relevant actions? Or is what matters that (2) I deliberate soundly, regardless of whether I actually do what I have reason to do? Or must (3) I comply with the reasons I have, and perform the relevant actions for these very reasons?

Littlejohn argues against each of these views. Against the first, Littlejohn argues that agents who are negligent, malicious or reckless may luckily succeed in doing what they have reason to do, but don't thereby do all that the reasons demand (117). Against the second, Littlejohn points out that we ordinarily distinguish between doing the right thing and citing ignorance as excuse for wrongdoing. But this view doesn't have the resources to make this distinction, since ignorance need not affect the soundness of one's deliberations (114-5). Against the third, Littlejohn argues that atheists should not doubt that people who conform to reasons from a sense of religious duty have done all that the reasons demanded (118).

Having rejected these three views, Littlejohn proposes a middle ground view according to which reasons demand that we conform to them, and further, that we are not indifferent about whether we comply with them (119). So one does something wrong if one either fails to do what the reasons demand, or else if one is indifferent to doing this. Littlejohn goes on to argue that this conclusion undermines views according to which the norm for belief is accordance with the evidence, as well as views according to which the norm for belief is knowledge.

But whilst Littlejohn's suggestion regarding what reasons demand is neat, the view is a compromise, and thereby faces attacks on both fronts. Defenders of view (1) above will point out that it is entirely possible for negligent people to do the right thing by mistake, but such a possibility seems to be conceptually incoherent according to Littlejohn's account. Vice versa, defenders of view (2) will think that Littlejohn's view has the same fault as view (1) in that it tells us that agents who do exactly what they think justified might nonetheless be acting irresponsibly. Littlejohn's response to this argument is that "responsibly" is ambiguous, so that such an agent is responsible in one sense, but irresponsible in another (114). But once we allow for this kind of ambiguity, it's not clear why we shouldn't just think that there is also an ambiguity in the question of what the reasons demand. We could say that there are two kinds of reasons -- reasons that pertain to rationality that demand sound deliberation, and reasons that pertain to the truth that demand correctness (cf. Reisner's and Ginsborg's papers). Littlejohn says little to undermine such a view, but it seems like an attractive possibility.

Reasons for Belief is well worth reading, in part just because it provides a useful overview that allows one to connect issues in epistemology with issues regarding other kinds of normativity, and that also allows one to connect together different issues within epistemology. One suspects that everyone stands to benefit from such a wider perspective.


Cuneo, T. 2007. The Normative Web. Oxford University Press.

Shah, N. 2003. "How Truth Governs Belief" in The Philosophical Review 112:4, pp. 447-482.

Sobel, D. and Wall, S. (eds.) 2009. Reasons for Action. Cambridge University Press.