Reasons from Within: Desires and Values

Placeholder book cover

Alan H. Goldman, Reasons from Within: Desires and Values, Oxford University Press, 2009, 275pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199576906.

Reviewed by Sarah K. Paul, University of Wisconsin-Madison


Alan Goldman's Reasons from Within offers a folksy, accessible articulation and defense of Existence Internalism about reasons, the thesis that the reasons a subject has must bear some connection to that particular subject's motivations. This is opposed to all varieties of the view that one can have "external" reasons that are not explained by any of one's antecedent desires or concerns. The debate over whether reasons are subjective or objective tends to proceed by way of explanatory scorekeeping, and Goldman's book nicely lays out the terrain of considerations that pull in each direction. As is well known, Objectivism about reasons is metaphysically costly: it faces obstacles in explaining how reasons motivate, why they seem to supervene on ordinary non-normative properties, and how we have epistemic access to them. Broadly Humean views on which all reasons are derived from or explained by subjective psychological facts are generally thought to be explanatorily superior in all three of these respects. Goldman's allegiance to Humean Internalism is strongly motivated by its perceived advantage from the perspective of a naturalistic, parsimonious metaphysics.

The challenge is to flesh out the details of the Humean view in a way that avoids extensional inadequacy -- its Achilles' heel in the scorekeeping enterprise. If a subject's reasons are generated by features of her idiosyncratic motivational psychology, she is liable to be in possession of both too many and too few reasons. Too many reasons because she may have irrational, rogue, or trivial motivations she intuitively has no reason to act on; too few reasons because there seem to be agent-neutral reasons of morality and prudence that apply to her whether or not she happens to be motivated by them. Goldman's strategy in defense of Internalism is to bite the bullet on the Too Few Reasons problem while attempting to block the Too Many Reasons problem. This tactic is the reverse of another recent and influential defense of Humeanism about reasons, Mark Schroeder's Slaves of the Passions. Schroeder accepts the implication that we have many more reasons than we might have thought but attempts to rescue the compatibility of Humeanism with the conviction that there are agent-neutral reasons. Together, these two approaches leave those who are otherwise impressed with the theoretical advantages of Subjectivism in the fortunate position of reflecting on which (if either) of these counterintuitive extensional implications is easier to swallow.

The problem of Too Many Reasons arises because, according to Humeanism, an agent's reasons for action are generated by her desires: she has reason to A just in case A-ing would satisfy some desire of hers. But we intuitively have no reason to indulge trivial desires to stay in bed instead of attending an important meeting or uninformed desires to drink a glass of what is in fact petrol. Goldman concedes this intuition and proposes a modification of traditional Humeanism that excludes trivial and uninformed desires from generating reasons. The strategy is to claim that reasons are not directly explained in terms of motivational facts, but indirectly by way of rationality. On his view, not all of an agent's actual desires generate reasons, but only those that would motivate a rational version of that agent to act. This is a tactic we might call "desire-laundering," familiar from the work of Bernard Williams, Richard Brandt, Harry Frankfurt, Michael Smith, and others. Reasons turn out to be non-normative states of affairs that would motivate a rational agent by indicating how a certain action would tend to satisfy her desires and concerns:

S has an F [moral, prudential, religious, aesthetic, …] reason R to do act A = S is F-minded, and because of that, if rational, would be motivated by awareness of R to do A (34).

Importantly, it is essential to the Internalist view that this motivational fact is explained by some antecedent concern of the agent's and not merely her awareness of that state of affairs or a belief that it is a reason for her.

So much is relatively familiar territory. Where the rubber hits the road for Goldman's version of Internalism is the demand to offer an independently plausible, naturalistic understanding of rationality that does not itself appeal to reasons. This is the task of Chapter Two. The most intriguing and original element of Goldman's proposal is that we should understand rationality as the avoidance of self-defeat. According to Goldman, rationality imposes two main requirements on us: information and coherence. First, a rational person is relevantly informed as to what it would be like to act or not act on the basis of her present desires. This will include objective information critical to the satisfaction of her desires, such as that the "gin" she wishes to drink is in fact petrol, as well as more subjective information concerning whether a course of action will serve to frustrate her deeper concerns. Second, rationality requires coherence in one's motivational set, understood as the resolution of conflict between mutually inconsistent concerns, the specification of broader concerns into more concrete goals, the adoption of means to these concrete ends, and the general coordination of one's actions with an eye to promoting the optimal mix of desire satisfaction over time. The rational pressure to acquire relevant information and to achieve motivational coherence is in each case pragmatic: these regulative ideals contribute to avoiding self-defeat, "defeat of one's own motivations" (72).

A pressing question arises here. Can the Subjectivist coherently claim that all agents are subject to normative pressure to avoid self-defeat, regardless of their particular desires? Goldman's move is to ground this normative authority in the "natural aim" of action. The idea is that agency has a constitutive aim that defines the standard of successful action, such that failing to realize this aim is a failure internal to agency as such and thus one that any creature in the agency business must see pressure to avoid. The argument appeals loosely to a natural selection analysis of function and is best understood by analogy with the capacity for belief. Goldman claims that the natural aim of belief is truth, because "organisms (systems in which beliefs function) with psychological states that store accurate information about the environments in which they live (true beliefs) are better able to act and survive … in those environments" (67) and that this explains why organisms with brains capable of true beliefs would be selected for. With respect to action, the claim is that the natural aim of action is to satisfy the motivation that prompted the action. "Believing is what we do when we want to arrive at the truth; acting is what we do when we want to satisfy our desires. Since desires are as natural to us as beliefs, and since as motivations they aim to be satisfied, this aim is a natural constitutive aim" (71). The conclusion is that because action naturally aims at desire satisfaction, we agents cannot sensibly raise the question of whether we have reason to act so as to satisfy our desires and thereby avoid self-defeat.

We should be suspicious about the quickness of these arguments and their ability to do the needed work in Goldman's account. First, it is not at all obvious that, as Goldman puts it, "actions are successful when they fulfill the motivations that prompt the actions" (71). Fulfilling the motivations that prompt the action seems to me neither necessary nor sufficient for successful action. Not sufficient because of the possibility of deviant causal chains, in which the desired outcome is brought about via an action prompted by that very desire but where the action itself is a failure. In Daniel Bennett's example, an unpracticed gunman may intend to shoot an enemy, miss by a mile, but cause a stampede of wild pigs with his shot that tramples the enemy to death. Not necessary because an action plan may be executed perfectly and yet leave the underlying motivation unsatisfied through no miscalculation of the agent's. The aforementioned gunman might have every reason to expect that killing his enemy will satisfy his desire for closure -- his trustworthy psychotherapist has assured him -- and might pull off his vengeful goal in just the way he had planned, only to find that he feels no resolution after all. For all that, he has successfully committed the murder he intended.

Even if we grant this standard of successful action in the particular case, it is unclear why it is constitutive of agency to aim at maximal desire satisfaction, as Goldman needs if the requirements of information and coherence are to have much bite. Does one really fail to be an agent if one aims only at local rather than global desire satisfaction? For Goldman, the fundamental source of failure is self-defeat, so falling short of maximal desire-satisfaction must turn out to be self-defeating if the rest is to follow. But in what sense could an action that succeeds in satisfying the desire that prompted it nonetheless constitute self-defeat? Goldman's thought seems to be that desires can be more or less "deep" or "central" to one's motivational set, and that these deep and central concerns might fail to motivate at a given time but nonetheless have more claim to be the concerns of the "self." Acting to satisfy peripheral desires at the expense of more authoritative concerns might then be said to constitute self-defeat.

But this line of thought is only as convincing as our ability to cash out the metaphors of "depth" and "centrality" with respect to desire. The difficulty is that Goldman needs these to be purely naturalistic notions that apply prior to any laundering for informedness and coherence, since the pressure to avoid self-defeat is supposed to justify those rational demands. This means that he cannot appeal to the Frankfurtian idea that the self emerges as the stable, wholehearted desiderative hierarchy that is the result of reflectively imposing coherence on one's desires. Goldman elaborates on the notions of depth and centrality in several ways, none of which are satisfying. First, he says that deeper concerns are "broader," both in the sense of connecting to many other concerns and in the sense of being more abstract than their more concrete specifications. But this is not elucidating until we know more about the kind of connections in question -- semantic connections? Causal connections? It is not clear why simply being more abstract or connected would entail greater authority.

Second, he claims that the state of desire typically involves an implicit evaluative judgment in favor of the object of desire, and that these judgments tend to reflect the depth of the subject's concerns in that the absence of an evaluative endorsement of a felt urge indicates that the urge is unstable and peripheral. But what exactly could the content of such judgments be? For the Subjectivist, evaluative judgments cannot be the recognition of some objective value in the desired state of affairs, but neither does Goldman want to be an Expressivist about them. This leads him to say that the concept 'good' deployed in the evaluative judgments typically involved in desire is a primitive, indefinable concept (113). This may serve to eliminate completely inexplicable urges from consideration, but I do not see how it can do the work of privileging some legitimate desires as more important to satisfy than others. For this we would need these judgments to be comparative, and Goldman's definition leaves no room for this; for all he says, these evaluative endorsements seem to be either present in a given desire or not. The upshot is that I do not see how much of anything the subject is actually motivated to do will count as self-defeat and therefore do not see how the necessity of avoiding self-defeat can ground the demand for rational desire-laundering.

Does Subjectivism need desire-laundering to work in order to be plausible? Goldman takes it to be an advantage of his version over Schroeder's that we end up with no reason to satisfy isolated whims to smash the crockery or turn on radios. But Schroeder seeks to sweeten the bitter pill of Too Many Reasons by rejecting what he calls Proportionalism: the view that when a reason is explained by a desire, the weight of that reason varies in proportion to the strength of the desire and to how well the action promotes that desire. In place of Proportionalism, Schroeder proposes an account of the weight of reasons according to which a reason has a certain weight just in case it is correct to place that much weight on it, where the correctness of reason-weighting is an agent-neutral standard and not a function of the strength of the relevant desire. If the account works, it allows Schroeder to hold that bizarre and isolated desires generate reasons of so little weight that they ordinarily escape notice altogether. The payoff is that Schroeder is also in a position to say that even if a given agent cares less for moral, prudential, or aesthetic considerations than a virtuous person would, that agent may yet have reasons to act on those considerations that are far weightier than her miserly concerns would suggest.

In contrast, Goldman accepts a version of Proportionalism according to which the strength of a set of reasons is proportional to the centrality of the concerns they reflect and to the expected efficacy of the recommended action in promoting those concerns. This is a much stronger brand of Subjectivism than that defended by Schroeder. For Goldman, the genuine amoralist, masochist, or philistine will have no reason to act on more virtuous considerations -- and perhaps more relevantly, those of us whose concerns for virtue are less central than they might be will have correspondingly weak reasons to act virtuously. This is a notoriously unappealing feature of traditional Humeanism that Goldman simply accepts as true; a large section of Chapter Four is devoted to defending the rationality of the knave. In this respect, unlike Schroeder's, Goldman's book does not represent an effort to make Humeanism any more palatable to those with Externalist intuitions -- there are still too few reasons.

This leaves a great deal resting on the arguments of Chapter Five against the notion of objective value, a commitment which Goldman takes to underlie the plausibility of external reasons. The charges here are well known. It is difficult to understand how objective values could be independent of actual motivations but rationally require motivation. To explain how objective values could be efficacious in causing us to recognize them as such and in motivating us to act, a tempting move is to claim that values are realized in ordinary physical properties, but this set of properties is so heterogeneous that they seem to have nothing in common in virtue of which they all count as values. Further, Goldman argues that if there is objective value, then we all ought to aim to maximize it. But this is both implausible and impracticable, for there is no way to measure degrees of objective value independently of how much people actually do value things. Value is only apparent to us by reference to our own concerns and projects, and it is impossible to call all of these concerns into question at once: "the view from nowhere is the view of no one" (211).

These are old questions, and Goldman does not consider new answers to them. He claims that the debate over the objectivity of values has not progressed since Thomas Nagel's (1977) response to J.L. Mackie's 'queerness' argument and so does not engage directly with more recent contributions to the debate. We should agree that Objectivist accounts fare worse with respect to the metaphysics and epistemology of value, but a more concrete examination of Objectivist attempts to mitigate these problems is needed if we are to draw any conclusions about how damaging they are. In sum, if my worries about the positive view are right, it is not clear that Goldman's book substantively changes the score in either direction. But it is an engaging and comprehensive articulation of Subjectivism and its naturalistic advantages in our understanding of reasons, and is in this regard a very welcome contribution to the literature.