Reasons in Action: A Reductionist Account of Intentional Action

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Ingmar Persson, Reasons in Action: A Reductionist Account of Intentional Action, Oxford University Press, 2019, 171pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198845034.

Reviewed by Andrei A. Buckareff, Marist College


Ingmar Persson is best known for his work in moral philosophy. Some of his publications have explored the boundary moral philosophy shares with the philosophy of action. But Persson is not someone whose name immediately comes to mind when thinking of the state of play in action theory. So it came as a bit of a surprise to me when I learned that he had published a monograph on the philosophy of action. This book is not Persson's first foray into the sub-discipline. It is based on his doctoral thesis completed in 1981. So it is a return of sorts, and the first of what I hope will be further work by Persson in the philosophy of action.

That this is a book based on a doctoral thesis completed almost forty years ago is worth keeping in mind. In places, it feels like a product of its time. This is owing, in part, to Persson's not engaging in much depth with some very important contributions published since 1981. Perhaps owing to the distance he kept over 39 years from the philosophy of action, Persson seems less apprehensive about defending positions that have few proponents. As a consequence, what he delivers is a book that offers some provocative and unconventional insights and makes a genuine contribution to the sub-discipline.

Persson promises his readers a conceptually reductive theory of intentional action that "does not appeal to any concepts that are distinctive of the domain of action theory" (1). Regardless of the success of his project of offering a conceptually reductive theory of action, what he presents is ultimately an ontologically reductive theory of action.

In terms of its general structure, the book can be divided thematically into three main parts. The first part consists of just the first chapter in which Persson offers some prolegomena to the remaining chapters of the book. The next three chapters focus on issues broadly related to reasons for action, including the structure of practical reasons, the nature of desire, motivation, reason-explanations, and practical deliberation. The remaining two chapters are primarily devoted to questions about intentional agency, including Persson's account of intentional overt action, mental action, and refraining.

While the chapters of the book can be grouped together under certain topics, the book is actually somewhat disjointed. For instance, Persson's discussion of reason-explanations is not really completed until chapter 6, after intervening treatments of other problems. As a consequence, tracing his arguments on a topic that presumably sets the stage for the discussion of another problem can be challenging. This is especially so in the case of what he writes about reasons and desires, since his remarks about their role in the etiology and explanation of action are not really completed until after his treatment of intentional action.

In the remainder of this review I will focus primarily on some of Persson's central claims about reasons for action, how they relate to desires, and the role of both in the etiology and explanation of intentional action. I will then briefly shift my attention to his theory of intentional action, with a particular focus on what he says about intention and the account he offers of basic intentional action. I will ignore what he says about other topics. This is not because what he says about them is uninteresting or uncontroversial, but given the space available, it is best to focus on the foundational problems that constitute the heart of his book.

Persson asserts that reasons for action can be represented as having a conditional form. The antecedent describes the action the reason favors, and the consequent represents "a state of affairs that for the agent supports or counts in favour of performing this action" (31). On his account, the antecedent of a reason-conditional does not have a settled truth value, but it must be epistemically possible that the antecedent will be true (32). Moreover, he contends that deliberation about whether or not to A presupposes that we represent ourselves as having a two-way power to or refrain from A-ing (39). The account safeguards our "deliberative freedom which allows us to line-up reason-conditionals for and against alternative actions" (40). Deliberative freedom involves a species of epistemic freedom according to which we can contemplate alternatives that, for all we know, are actual possibilities.

Regarding what we are referring to when we discuss reasons for action, Persson makes the common distinction found in much of the literature between real and apparent reasons. The former objectively favor performing or refraining from some action, while the latter involve the contents of our beliefs, whether they are true or false (42).

As for explanatory reasons (reasons why an agent As), Persson takes them to be facts about the agent -- e.g., that a person has a particular thought. An explanatory reason is not the content of a thought, as would be the case with apparent reasons. Thus, the scope of "explanatory reasons" is fairly wide, picking out any considerations that explain why something occurred. In cases where an explanatory reason involves an apparent reason, the content of the apparent reason may or may not represent a real reason (42-43). But explanatory reasons qua apparent or real reasons are themselves not causes, according to Persson. Reason-explanations on his account are teleological explanations. They supply "a goal or end [represented in the content] at which the action is directed" (44). While not reducible to causal explanations, Persson argues that a reason-explanation of an action implies that there is a causal explanation owing to a fact about a reason for action incorporating "a reference to a desire of the subject" (46).

Regarding desires, Persson describes them as coming in degrees of strength, with the strongest ones being the ones upon which we act (47-48). He further distinguishes between non-intelligent and intelligent desires. The former are instinctive or innate (e.g., the desire to avoid a source of pain). Such desires contribute to behaviors that are not guided by an agent's conscious thought. On the other hand, intelligent desires are represented in conscious practical thinking. Acting to satisfy them is what distinguishes intentional actions from unintentional actions. An intelligent desire to cause that that an agent believes can be acted upon is labelled a "decisive desire" (57-59).

As for the ontology of desires, Persson takes an occurrent desire to cause p to be a physical fact about an agent that "tends to cause something to be a fact because it is taken by the subject to be p" (46). For Persson, facts are the relata in causation and differ from events because they involve the instantiation of a specific property by something, rather than, as in the case of events, the instantiation of "an indefinite set of properties" (15, emphasis added). Persson also endorses property-dualism and epiphenomenalism about mental facts (133). Mental facts are non-causally connected to other mental facts and to physical facts in virtue of their contents. That said, Persson assumes that the neural correlates of mental facts are causally connected (24). A desire is a fact about an agent that is a cause. So that means that, on his account, desires are not mental under any description. They are neural states simpliciter that are "identified in terms of their interaction with mental phenomena like thoughts" (133). Presumably, this interaction between thoughts and desires is non-causal.

I have to confess that I find Persson's theory of desire to be rather perplexing. First, he grants that desires have content, with the qualification that they lack "any distinctive conative content in the way that a belief has a distinctive propositional or true-or-false content" (64). The content of a desire would be more like an imperative sentence. He also notes that desires have the "direction of fit of . . . making facts fit their contents" (60), with the intentional object of desires being "to bring it about that p" (64). Presumably, a given desire moves us because it represents some state of affairs as being pursuit-worthy, either as a means to an end or as an end in itself, something on which Persson seems to agree (54-55). Second, he also recognizes that at least occurrent intelligent desires appear to be conscious episodes (49-51). That is, there is something it is like to desire that that is different from what it is like to have a belief about one's desire that p. So desires look like mental facts. If they are physical facts, it seems reasonable to take them to be mental at least under some description. But since desires can be conscious and are contentful representational states of agents that are directed at states of affairs, Persson's assertion that desires are not mental facts is quite puzzling.

Moving to Persson's theory of intentional action, perhaps not surprisingly, he eschews agent-causal and volitionist approaches. But Persson goes further by not assigning irreducible intentions any role in his theory of intentional action. According to him, decisive desires in combination with thoughts directed at an end play the executive functional role that most philosophers of action these days would assign to irreducible intentions. His reason for this move is that he seems to assume that considerations of simplicity demand that we have one type of mental state with a world-to-mind direction of fit. My worry is that, while intentions and desires have the same direction of fit, they have different functional profiles, and, more importantly, they have very different content. The functional profile of Persson's decisive desires is similar to the one associated with intentions, given that both are mental states that dispose an agent not to engage in further deliberation about what to do (60, cf. Bratman 1987, 20). But, this makes decisive desires functionally very different from standard predominant desires, which do not constrain further deliberation and can be overruled by an agent's personal policies that are not obviously reducible to desires themselves. If we suppose that decisive desires and intentions are functionally equivalent there is still a difference between the content of intentions and desires. For instance, many, following Michael Bratman (1987), take an intention's content to include an action-plan. But it is hard to see how desires can accommodate such content (particularly if a desire's content represents an imperative or something as good). There are other considerations that favor treating intentions as irreducible and significantly different from desires that I cannot canvass here. Suffice it to say that the lack of any sustained engagement on the part of Persson with recent work on intentions is a serious gap in his analysis.

Turning to actions, Persson urges conceiving of actions in terms most often associated with componential approaches to action-individuation. He initially asserts that an action is a causal process. An action commences with its cause and terminates with the occurrence of its result (16). While Persson maintains that the concept of intentional action entails the concept of causation, he denies that the concept of action can be reduced to the concept of causation (23). Moreover, it becomes apparent by the time we get to any discussion of mental actions that not all actions are causal processes (recall that mental facts are not causally connected to one another). But the general point he makes about actions as causal processes holds for overt actions.

Persson offers a causal sufficient condition for intentional overt basic action, identifying it as "the correspondence control model of intentional basic action, CORCON":

You intentionally perform the basic action of causing p now if you now have an occurrent decisive desire to cause p directly -- that is, without causing anything as a means to it -- and this desire now causes something because you correctly think that it is that p. (94)

Persson avoids articulating the conditions for performing intentional overt basic actions as necessary because of cases where one may have a decisive desire to cause p and and cases where an agent may decisively desire to try to cause p (95). It seems that the variable used in the analysis is doing a lot of work for Persson, motivating him to reject the analysis as offering any necessary conditions. But this is odd given that the variable 'p' can stand proxy for the conjunction 'and q' and even for 'try to p'.

Furthermore, despite Persson's stated view, it seems that CORCON smuggles in a necessary condition for intentional overt basic action. He writes that:

as long as a basic action . . . is intentional, it is throughout its duration under the control of your conception of what you do. And if the action is to be intentional, its result must correspond to this conception and make it true. (94, emphasis added)

So, some overt behavior will fail to count as an intentional action if what occurs does not correspond to what the agent represents themself as doing at the time. That we have a successful fit between what is represented in an agent's thought and what is occurring is a non-causal criterion that must be satisfied in order for the causal process that is an agent's overt behavior to count as an intentional action (98). Persson even treats this condition as necessary for intentional action in responding to the problem of basic causal deviance and in accounting for agential guidance in acting. Therefore, I am uncertain why he does not state the conditions he offers in CORCON as necessary and sufficient at least for intentional overt basic action.

Future work by Persson will hopefully bring CORCON into deeper conversation with recent research on intentional agency, both in philosophy and the special sciences. It remains an open question whether the theory of action he offers is a viable alternative to some of the standard proposals widely accepted in the philosophy of action today. My advice to readers is to approach Persson's book as providing a sketch of a theory of action. The ultimate success of the theory hinges on its architect's either jettisoning or clarifying some of its more puzzling aspects.


Bratman, M. (1987) Intentions, plans, and practical reason. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.