Reasons, Patterns, and Cooperation

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Christopher Woodard, Reasons, Patterns, and Cooperation, Routledge, 2008, 149pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415958493.

Reviewed by Rob Lawlor, University of Leeds


In Reasons, Patterns, and Cooperation, Christopher Woodard argues in favour of the existence of pattern-based reasons. He writes:

A (teleological) pattern-based reason for or against doing φ is a reason that derives from the good or bad consequences of a pattern, P, of which φ is merely a part. (p. 28)

Woodard begins the book by appealing to an ordinary language distinction between being principled and being pragmatic. It becomes clear that, on his understanding of the distinction, being pragmatic involves being concerned with the consequences of one's actions, while being principled involves following simple rules, such as do not lie or do not kill. In relation to this contrast, Woodard explains that the aim of his book is to sketch a theory (or at least the structure of a theory) that will find the right balance between being pragmatic and being principled.

This seems to me to be the weakest point of the book. Although I agree that this is a distinction made in ordinary language, it is a distinction that seems to collapse on closer inspection. For example, although Woodard considers it to be the paradigmatic example of a pragmatic theory, act-consequentialism (defined as "the view that one should always maximise the impartial good" [p. 138]) seems to me to be highly principled. It has just one principle, and it does not allow for exceptions.

Woodard writes that "Being principled is a matter of robustness across relevant changes in circumstances" (p. 104). But one has to ask, what is relevant? Woodard cites deontology and rule-consequentialism as examples of principled theories. This is because they are relatively robust in insisting that we, for example, refrain from lying or breaking promises. If lying would have good consequences, the deontologist would resist this relevant change in circumstances. But why can't we also say that act-consequentialism is principled because it sticks to its principle of maximising the good, and is robust in relation to different considerations, such as the fact that the agent promised to do something else, or that the medicine belongs to one agent and not another?

Both theories stick to their principles and give little or no weight to considerations that others might insist ought to be given more weight. If we think that this is a flaw in either case, it seems to be a mistake to put this in terms of the theory not being pragmatic enough. If we think the deontologist does not give enough weight to the consideration of consequences, we should not say that his mistake is that he is too principled. Rather, his mistake is that he has the wrong principles. Consider again what Woodard says: "Being principled is a matter of robustness across relevant changes in circumstances." If the particular changes we are considering are relevant, then our principles ought to recognise their relevance, and the theory should not be robust across these changes. They should be robust only across irrelevant changes in circumstances. Act-consequentialism, for example, is (relatively) robust across changes regarding the costs to the agents because (as optimisers) act-consequentialists do not believe in prerogatives, and believe that the agent’s interests should count no more (and no less) than anyone else’s and that, beyond that, changes regarding the costs to an agent are irrelevant to the permissibility of an act. If we object to this, we should not say that the act-consequentialist is too principled. We should say, rather, that he has the wrong principle.

However, I would urge readers to look past this flaw. If I hadn't been reviewing this book, I may have been tempted to leave the book before finishing the first chapter. Had I done so, I would have missed out on a careful discussion of an interesting and important issue. Further, and more importantly, the arguments presented in this book do not (as far as I can see) rely on this distinction. Woodard's aims can be characterised in other ways, without referring to the distinction between being principled and being pragmatic. For example, Woodard often focuses his discussion around Williams' examples of George the Chemist (deciding whether or not to accept a job working on bio-chemical weapons) and Jim and the Indians (Jim having to decide whether or not to shoot one person, knowing that, if he doesn't, Pedro will kill twenty). In these terms, his aim is to construct a theory that will give a plausible answer in these (and other) cases. More specifically, after quickly dismissing the nonconsequentialist explanations (pp. 10-15, and briefly again throughout), Woodard's aim is to offer a sketch of the structure of a teleological theory that would be able to give a plausible explanation of the intuitions that we have in the Williams cases (he largely assumes that we will share Williams' worry that act-consequentialism misses something in its explanation of these cases). He does this by arguing for the existence of pattern-based reasons, constructing a pluralist theory that includes both act-based reasons and pattern-based reasons.

In the case of Jim and the Indians, Woodard's claim is that Jim has an act-based reason to shoot the one, because this will save nineteen lives. But he also has a pattern-based reason not to shoot, because not shooting is the only way that Jim could be a part of the ideal situation in which no one in the group shoots and no one dies. (A group-based reason is one example of a pattern-based reason.)

The act-based reason and the pattern-based reason are both pro tanto reasons, and, in the case of Jim and the Indians, the act-based reason is conclusive. This, Woodard claims, does justice to the intuition that most people share with Williams -- that it is plausible to think that Jim should shoot the one, but it is not plausible to think that the choice is as simple as act-consequentialism suggests. The result is a pluralist theory that considers both act-based reasons and pattern-based reasons. Woodard claims that:

pluralism implies that multiple units of action can generate conflicting reasons within a single underlying value. Thus utilitarians, for example, can recognise basic conflicts of reasons. They can say of Jim, for instance, that he has conflicting reasons associated with two different units of action, one consisting of his own action only, and the other consisting of his action together with Pedro's … It makes more sense to think of his reason not to shoot as stemming from the same basic concern, with the hostages' interests in some sense, than to think of it as stemming from a conflicting concern with his own integrity, or indeed anything else.

Above, I stated that Woodard characterised his project as an attempt to find a balance between being too principled and too pragmatic. I argued that it was a mistake to try to do this, but argued that Woodard’s project could be characterised in other ways, saying that one alternative was to see the project as an attempt to construct a theory that will give plausible answers in cases like Williams' Jim and the Indians case. Another alternative characterisation of Woodard's book (and the characterisation I favour) is to say that he is arguing for two claims: first, that there are pattern-based reasons, and second that we don't need deontological constraints because pattern-based reasons are the only things that we need to add to the act-based reasons found in act-teleological theories in order to construct a plausible theory, and to explain the kind of intuitions Williams had, which Woodard evidently shares.

On either of these characterisations of Woodard's project, it is possible to appreciate, and engage with, his arguments without having to accept the distinction between being pragmatic and being principled. More importantly, this focus on pattern-based reasons (and also on the pluralist approach) seems to me to be an important contribution to moral theory, and an approach that is worthy of further consideration and debate. Woodard himself clearly sees his book as the start of a project, sketching the structure of a theory, rather than offering a fully constructed theory with all the details filled in. (See pp. 8-9.)

Because of the nature of Woodard's project, it is natural to compare Woodard's approach with others. After all, his stated aim is to construct a theory that will have the advantages of act-consequentialism and rule-consequentialism, without their flaws, and he rejects deontology.

Woodard doesn't really argue against act-consequentialism. Rather, his starting point, as I have suggested above, is to take for granted that there are problems with act-consequentialism. It just doesn't seem plausible when considering particular cases. Thus, it is taken for granted that some kind of move away from act-consequentialism is desirable. The real question, for Woodard, is whether it is possible to make that move without going all the way to rule-consequentialism, or even deontology, both of which he considers to be too principled.

Focusing on Hooker's Ideal Code, Real World (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000), Woodard claims that rule-consequentialism is too simplistic, with very basic rules, such as tell the truth and keep your promises, making exceptions only in order to avoid disaster. But this is not a charitable interpretation of Hooker. His view is much subtler than this. Woodard backs up his interpretation by quoting Hooker as saying that blindly following such rules can result in disaster and arguing that rule-consequentialism would be absurd if it advocated blind obedience to these rules (p. 103). And it is true that Hooker does talk about disaster avoidance on a number of occasions in ways that do seem to support Woodard's interpretation. However, a look at other passages from Hooker's book suggests a subtler theory.

Hooker stresses not only that there are exceptions to rules, but also that he sees the rules as pro tanto rules and he acknowledges "the role of judgement in adjudicating conflicts between general duties in some situations." (See Hooker, Ideal Code, Real World, pp. 88-92.)

For Hooker, different rules have different strengths. Therefore, to know whether an act is permissible or not, it is necessary to know more than just what the rules are. You need to have an understanding of the relative strength of different rules, to weigh them against each other.

Thus, Hooker stresses that the set of rules that he has in mind is more than just a code that one simply follows: "It also involves having sensitivities, emotions and beliefs … . to accept a code of rules is just to have a moral conscience of a certain shape." (Hooker, Ideal Code, Real World, p. 91.)

I don't think Hooker helps himself when he talks about disaster avoidance. But a charitable reading of Hooker suggests a view much more subtle than the view Woodard rejects. Although disaster avoidance may be the only legitimate reason to break the rule do not kill, Hooker I am sure would agree that something less significant would be sufficient to justify the breaking of the rule keep your promises, especially if the promise made is itself relatively trivial.

If we understand Hooker in this way, it is not clear that Woodard's approach has the advantage he claims. In fact, in this particular respect, the two theories are very similar, both involving the weighing of conflicting reasons. And, in both cases, different reasons can have different strengths. (If you are not convinced that this is the right interpretation of Hooker, consider his comparison of his own theory with Ross's moral pluralism in Ideal Code, Real World, section 4.5 and -- in more detail -- in "Intuitions and Moral Theorizing" in Philip Stratton-Lake (ed.), Ethical Intuitionism: Re-evaluations, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2002.)

Furthermore, if Woodard's aim is to move away from some of the counter-intuitive implications of act-consequentialism, his theory has one significant disadvantage, compared with Hooker's. For many, the wish to resist act-consequentialism is based on the idea that there is something wrong with saying that it is obviously and straightforwardly right to kill one if doing so will save two (or more). In considering the case of Jim and the Indians, Woodard can disassociate himself from the act-consequentialist approach by appealing to the importance of pattern-based reasons.

This way of responding to the problem, however, has implications that Woodard doesn't seem to have fully recognised -- at least, he does not discuss them in detail. On Woodard's account, there is a very big difference between cases in which people's lives are put at risk by other agents and cases in which people's lives are put at risk in some other way. Consider the following cases:

(1) If I don't shoot and kill one person, someone else will shoot and kill five people.

(2) A train, without a driver, is heading towards five people, who are stuck on the track. I could stop this by shooting an innocent bystander, who will fall in front of the train, and stop it before it hits the five.

For Woodard, there is a big difference between these two cases. In case (1), there is a group-based reason not to shoot. Considered as a group, the best outcome is the one in which neither of us shoots. My not shooting is the only way that I can play my part in bringing about this outcome. For Woodard, this is significant even if I know that the other person will shoot, and it gives me a reason not to shoot despite this -- though this reason may or may not be conclusive.

In case (2) though, there is no other agent whose actions can be considered alongside my own to give me a group-based reason not to shoot. My action is not part of a larger pattern. Therefore, Woodard is left with the act-consequentialist part of his theory, and he cannot provide a reason to refrain from shooting and killing the innocent bystander. As in Williams' cases, even if we think that shooting the innocent bystander is justified in this case, it seems implausible to think that there is no reason at all to refrain from shooting.

Woodard's account may give plausible explanations in some cases, but it seems much less plausible in cases of killing where the killing is a response to a threat that is posed in some way that doesn't involve other agents. Hooker's rule-consequentialism, on the other hand, suggests that we have a reason (conclusive or otherwise) not to shoot in both cases. This seems much more plausible, and seems to be a more desirable result for the individual trying to move away from the counter-intuitive implications of act-consequentialism.

If I were to compare Woodard's approach with deontological theories, my arguments would be based on very similar considerations. Obviously, deontological theories will have the same advantage over Woodard's approach that rule-consequentialism has. Similarly, I also think that Woodard is too quick to dismiss the deontological accounts. In particular, he focuses primarily on agent-relativity. There is no discussion of rights, and no consideration of Ross-style moral pluralism (with its distinction between the duty of nonmaleficence and the duty of beneficence) or Kamm's idea of inviolability or her rejection of the idea that nonconsequentialism should be understood in terms of agent-relativity.

As I said, however, Woodard has two aims: to argue that there are pattern-based reasons and to argue that pattern-based reasons are all that need to be added to act-teleology to get a plausible theory. I remain unconvinced by Woodard's attempt to argue for the second of these claims. But nothing I have said counts against Woodard's claim that there are pattern-based reasons.

In relation to this claim, however, I do have one major concern. Discussing a case that he calls Potential Torturers, Woodard describes a situation in which you can choose whether or not to be involved in the torture of three men, by simply pressing a button, but where you know that the three men will be tortured regardless of your decision, because there are three other men with similar buttons and you know that they will press theirs (if all four of you press your buttons, the fourth press will have no effect). Describing why his theory would tell you not to press the button, he writes: "Your act of pushing the button is instrumentally neutral, but it is part of patterns that make the best outcome, in which no one is tortured, impossible." (p. 87)

My concern here is that if we ask why the pushing of the button is instrumentally neutral, we will get the answer that it is neutral because we know that the other three people will press their buttons (so the three men will be tortured no matter what you do). But, if we know this, we also know that the best outcome, in which no one is tortured, is already impossible. If this is the case, it is not obvious why there is any reason to refrain from doing something that will make the best outcome impossible, if the best outcome is already impossible. In fact, it is not clear that it is even possible to make impossible something that is already impossible.

Yet, there is something persuasive about Woodard's appeal to pattern-based reasons that makes me think that it would be a mistake to dismiss his account too quickly.

Ultimately, Reasons, Patterns, and Cooperation offers a new theory that could be a candidate for the title of most plausible version of consequentialism (though I still see it as a contender, rather than the title-holder). And, for others less sympathetic to consequentialist approaches to ethics, the book is no less interesting, albeit in different ways. Even if not convinced that an appeal to pattern-based reasons can do the job of deontological constraints, I think it would be a mistake not to take seriously the claim that we may need to add pattern-based reasons to the list of reasons we already recognise.

Even if Woodard hasn't convinced me that there definitely are pattern-based reasons, he has convinced me that this is an important possibility that requires further consideration. For those who do want to take this possibility seriously, Woodard's book seems to me to be a good place to start.