Reasons, Rights, and Values

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Robert Audi, Reasons, Rights, and Values, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 301pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107480803.

Reviewed by Justin Snedegar, University of St Andrews


This book collects eleven of Robert Audi's recent papers, written since 1997, when he published Moral Knowledge and Ethical Character. The essays are helpfully organized into three parts, dealing, respectively, with the theory of reasons, normative ethics, and practical ethics. Though the division makes sense, the three parts also come together to present a unified picture of the normative realm as fundamentally pluralistic and our knowledge of it as due in large part to moral intuition. The essays are further unified in that they all illustrate Audi's characteristic careful and systematic thinking. Perhaps a better word than 'systematic' would be 'comprehensive'. Throughout his career Audi has made invaluable contributions to ethics, metaethics, practical rationality, epistemology, and applied ethics. This book is no exception: the essays leave very little of the normative domain unexplored or untheorized. The result is a picture of normativity that is often complex but rich with important distinctions. Rather than discussing each of the essays in detail, I will give an overview of each of the three parts of the book. I will raise some questions along the way, focusing especially on Audi's treatment of reasons, reasoning, and value. I will have to be much more brief in my treatment of other parts of the book, especially Part III.

The first part of the book explores both structural and substantive issues in the theory of practical reasons. The essays cover (i) the nature of and relationships between practical reasons, the capacity of practical reason, the process of practical reasoning, and the evaluation of the latter two notions; (ii) intrinsic value and its relationship to practical reasons; and (iii) the relationship between morality and practical rationality. I will focus my discussion on two broad themes that run through the essays in Part I: the role of experience and the relationship between practical and theoretical reasoning.

Though Audi is perhaps most famous for his defense of intuitionism in ethics, experiences are central to Audi's picture, especially his views on rationality and reasons. This comes out most clearly in "The Grounds and Structure of Reasons for Action". First, rational action requires both belief and desire (71), and experience serves as both a cause and a rational ground of many of our beliefs and desires. An experience can serve as a rational ground for belief that p by having qualities that indicate the truth of p. Similarly, an experience can serve as a rational ground for a desire to A by having qualities that indicate that A is valuable in some way.

Noticing this lets us appreciate one reason for distinguishing between the process of practical reasoning and the capacity of practical reason and aligning practical rationality most directly with the latter. Audi argues most directly for this picture in "Reasons, Practical Reason, and Practical Reasoning". There are many cases of rational action that seem not to be the result of any reasoning. Rather, experience allows us to appreciate the reasons for acting in some way, and we act in that way in response to those reasons, without going through any kind of reasoning. So while rational action can be the result of practical reasoning, it can also be the result of simply responding to reasons, which we recognize through experience.

Experience has another important role to play in Audi's picture. In addition to allowing us to appreciate practical reasons and act on their basis, experiences can serve as grounds of practical reasons themselves. This is because Audi accepts an experientialist theory of intrinsic value -- the view that only experiences have intrinsic value -- and holds that intrinsically valuable experiences ground value-based practical reasons. Roughly, we have reason to perform actions that promote or preserve intrinsically valuable experiences -- either ours or someone else's. This view is developed in several essays in Part I.

Putting together Audi's view that experience can serve as both a rational ground of desire and intention and as the ground of practical reasons themselves brings out another important role for experience. Experience can make us aware of moral reasons. In addressing the question of why we should be moral, in "Practical Reason and the Status of Moral Obligation", Audi appeals to the fact that the kinds of social experiences almost all of us have will make us aware of moral reasons, since these reasons will be grounded in the experiences of others, which we can learn about through experience. Knowing about the moral reasons for acting in some way can be enough to make acting in that way rationally permissible and sometimes rationally required.

The second theme I wish to discuss is the relationship between practical reasoning -- thinking about what to do -- and theoretical reasoning -- thinking about what to believe. Audi believes that neither is reducible to the other, though there are parallels with respect to the structure and evaluation of the two kinds of reasoning. He also believes that theoretical reasoning enjoys a certain limited kind of priority over practical reasoning. Rational beliefs can affect what it's practically rational to do, intend, or desire, but rational intentions or desires cannot affect what it's rational to believe.

One notable feature of Audi's conception of practical reasoning is that even though practical reasoning is thinking about what to do, its conclusions are beliefs. In particular, they are beliefs in normative propositions, like that I ought to raise my arm, or that it would be good to bake some bread. This is in contrast to views according to which the conclusion of practical reasoning is something more "practical", like an intention or even an action.

One consequence of this is that Audi can carry over many plausible things he says about the structure and evaluation of theoretical reasoning to the case of practical reasoning. For example, in assessing a piece of practical reasoning -- as in assessing a piece of theoretical reasoning -- it is important to pay attention to the logical and other truth-indicative relations between the premises and the conclusion. For example, the premise 'Doing A would be best' can make the conclusion 'I ought to do A' rational because it makes it likely to be true.

But on an alternative view according to which the conclusion of practical reasoning is an intention, things don't seem to work this way. Intentions are not the kinds of things that can be true or made more likely to be true. The objects of intentions may be propositions (though Audi would dispute this, see especially 76-81). But practical reasoning that concludes in an intention doesn't seem to have a structure such that the premises make this proposition (likely to be) true. So the broadly epistemic kinds of assessment that Audi appeals to will not be straightforwardly appropriate.

One reason for preferring this kind of view is that on Audi's more theoretical conception of practical reasoning, on which it issues in beliefs in normative conclusions, it is hard to distinguish genuine practical reasoning from theoretical reasoning about what one ought to do, as may happen in the pages of an applied ethics journal. To put things impressionistically, Audi's conception of practical reasoning threatens to miss out on why it is genuinely practical.

One place where this distinction becomes important is in Audi's discussion of the assessment of practical reasoning and his claim that sometimes the most rational thing to do is to suspend judgment as a result of practical reasoning (23). For example, if you have limited information about the relevant reasons and what they support, it may be most rational to suspend judgment about what you should do. It may be sensible to suspend belief about what you should do, but it seems that practical rationality can require us not to suspend intention about what to do, if the time has come to act.

Audi gets close to addressing this issue. He recognizes that when facing a practical question of what to do, we just have to decide, even if the best we can do is reach some weak, prima facie conclusion (24). In such cases, our expression of the conclusion of practical reasoning will be modest, e.g., "I believe I'd better concentrate on the older child's problems today" (28). But then, since we do just have to decide, he says, awkwardly, that the modest conclusion is not in fact what we believe or what we've concluded. Instead, he thinks that the conclusion will actually be a stronger claim about our overall obligation. The problem here is that such a strong conclusion is unwarranted in the situation, and we know it. If we treat the conclusion of practical reasoning as instead an intention, we can avoid saying this. The belief we end up with is the warranted weak, prima facie judgment -- the one most naturally expressed by what we'd actually say. But since we do just have to decide, our genuinely practical conclusion is the intention to act in the way that seems best, given our limited information.

In Part II, Audi develops aspects of his "new intuitionism", which is a development of W. D. Ross's intuitionist pluralism from The Right and the Good. Audi improves upon, or at least goes beyond, Ross's theory in several ways. Most importantly, he gives us a fuller account of the nature of intuition, enriches the epistemic resources available to the intuitionist, provides a limited systematization of the various prima facie duties, and shows how to integrate ideas from Kantian ethics and virtue ethics.

Moral intuitions, in the sense most relevant here, are moral judgments (e.g., that it would be wrong to steal this car) that typically result from a kind of capacity ('intuition') we have. In "Intuitions, Intuitionism, and Moral Judgment", Audi draws an analogy between visual perception and intuition: both tend to result in beliefs that are typically justified, or at least are beliefs for which we have some reason, and may constitute knowledge. Moreover, these beliefs are immediate and non-inferential.

Audi follows Ross in holding that our beliefs in the principles of prima facie duty (that lying, stealing, harming, etc. are prima facie wrong, for example) are often the result of moral intuition and are self-evident -- justified without appeal to any other premises or evidence. Roughly, the idea is that these principles are part of the very concept of moral wrongness (136-139). Audi also believes that our particular moral judgments -- for example, that I have a moral reason not to steal this car in this situation -- can be intuitive and self-evident. Here the analogy with visual perception becomes especially important and, for some philosophers, especially mysterious: Audi claims that we apprehend, in a way analogous to visual perception, fittingness relations between the considerations that constitute the moral reasons and the action in question (140).

So this apprehension of fittingness relations is one way in which our particular moral judgments can come about, and indeed can constitute knowledge. But we may also subsume the situation under a general moral principle that we know via moral intuition. In this kind of case, our particular moral judgment is not an intuition since it is inferential. Similarly, we sometimes form a general moral judgment as a kind of abstraction or induction from particular moral judgments that are non-inferential moral intuitions. In this case, the general moral judgment is inferential and so not an intuition.

This brings us to an important advance Audi makes over earlier intuitionists. He believes that though we can know some moral propositions without appeal to other premises or evidence, we can also come to know them inferentially. In cases like this, your knowledge of the proposition is inferential even though the proposition is self-evident and so knowable non-inferentially.

Allowing self-evident propositions to be proved by other propositions is also crucial to one of the most important aspects of Audi's brand of intuitionism. Following Ross, many versions of intuitionism -- including Audi's -- are pluralistic. One complaint about such a view is that there seems to be nothing that unifies the things that it treats as morally important. Audi attempts to remedy this by showing how many, though probably not all, of the principles of prima facie duty can be derived from a broadly Kantian focus on treating people as ends in themselves rather than merely as means. This does not mean these principles can only be known, or depend for their truth, on such a derivation. The idea is rather that the Kantian injunctions characterize the purpose or telos of morality, and so the principles of prima facie duty are then unified in that they are the principles that flow from the purpose of morality (168). He also appeals to this idea to show how to resolve some cases of conflicts between prima facie duties: when one action would involve violating a Kantian injunction but the other would not, the second is to be preferred even if they are otherwise equally well supported by prima facie duties.

Two questions about this appeal to Kantian injunctions are important. First, given that (i) the principles of prima facie duties do not depend for their truth on these injunctions, and (ii) it seems doubtful that all of them will follow from the Kantian injunctions, we may ask in what sense the Kantian injunctions truly systematize the prima facie duties. We may think, instead, that we just have two different ways of thinking about morality that nevertheless agree in many of their verdicts about what's morally important. Second, though Audi works at length to try to dispel this worry, it sometimes looks as if the role of the Kantian injunctions in conflict resolution is simply as additional prima facie duties that support one or the other action. This would undermine Audi's claim that they have a more fundamental role to play.

The last two essays in Part II involve very interesting discussions of moral virtue. One lesson of "Moral Virtue and Reasons for Action" is that we generally only have a limited and indirect kind of control over which of our reasons we act for when there are multiple reasons supporting the same action. Since being virtuous plausibly requires acting for the right kinds of reasons, our direct control over how virtuous we are is similarly limited. The best we can do, often, is take indirect strategies to make ourselves especially sensitive to the right kinds of reasons.

The last part of the book applies some of the ideas developed in Parts I and II to topics of social concern. First, Audi argues in "Wrongs within Rights" that we have moral obligations that go beyond what are determined by rights. This has the consequence that we may do something we have the moral right to do and still be morally criticizable. An example is failing to donate money to charity: we may have the moral right to keep our money, as no one else has a right to it, but we are still morally criticizable as selfish if we don't donate and may in fact have an obligation to donate. His conclusion is that a purely rights-based theory of ethics will be inadequate.

I can only briefly mention the last two essays on applied ethics. In "Religion and the Politics of Science", Audi discusses the recent debate over the teaching of intelligent design in science education and develops a notion of religious neutrality that may be useful in designing policy governing the teaching of science. Finally, in "Nationalism, Patriotism, and Cosmopolitanism in an Age of Globalization", he discusses the justification of various kinds of patriotic or nationalistic attitudes and practices compared to an extreme cosmopolitanism. He applies this to debates concerning globalization, including the exporting and importing of culture across different societies.

As should be clear by now, the essays in this book have a very broad scope, covering a huge swath of the normative domain. Space constraints have kept me from discussing most of this in any detail, but I hope to have brought out a few of the most interesting issues and indicated where it might be fruitful to press.

Audi's work is extremely thorough and rich and will reward careful readers. I recommend this book to anyone interested in moral philosophy and indeed in normativity more generally.