Reasons Why

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Bradford Skow, Reasons Why, Oxford University Press, 2016, 195pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198785842.

Reviewed by Christopher Pincock, Ohio State University


Bradford Skow's elegant and tightly argued book goes very much against the prevailing tide of recent discussions of scientific explanation. While many emphasize the pluralism and contextualism of explanatory practice, Skow offers a remarkably simple account of explanation for events: the reasons why an event occurs are always either causes or grounds of that event. Skow's defense of this account is ingenious and worth taking seriously. If he is right, then his scientific explanations can be fruitfully integrated into the explanations developed in the metaphysics of science. In this short review I can only sketch some of the core ideas of Skow's approach and raise a few preliminary questions.

It is important to emphasize that Skow does not frame his account as a theory of explanation, but as a theory of reasons why. He claims that philosophers have been confused about their theoretical target: "I do not see that philosophers of science should also want a theory of explanation properly so-called. Explaining is, primarily, a speech act, something people do with words" (9). When a scientist considers a why-question such as "why did the dinosaurs go extinct?", they aim to find an answer to this question. Skow insists that the answer is properly described as a reason why: a reason why the dinosaurs became extinct is that a comet or asteroid hit the Earth. It is a separate and largely irrelevant question for the philosopher of science, Skow argues, to consider when such an answer constitutes an explanation. He does not offer an account of the speech act of explaining, but the rough idea is that only some ways of giving a reason why will count as explanations: "Maybe to explain an answer one must go through it slowly and clearly" (8).

Skow thus deals with claims of the form "That R is a reason why Q". His primary focus is the case where Q is a fact that "corresponds to the occurrence of a concrete event" (27). Neither the fact that 2+2=4 nor the fact that all whales are mammals corresponds to the occurrence of a concrete event, so reasons why these facts obtain are not Skow's main concern. With these qualifications in mind, Skow develops his theory of reasons why by starting with a simple causal theory and refining it as problems arise. A major inspiration here is the causal theory of explanation offered by David Lewis. When translated into talk of reasons why, Lewis' view is that R is a reason why Q just in case the fact that R is a cause of the fact that Q (28). This theory is immediately rejected using the existence of reasons why that are not causes, but are instead grounds. Skow relies on examples to get the reader to accept the existence of grounds and their distinctness from causes. One example involves disjunction: a reason why R or G is R, but R is not a cause of R or G. R is instead a ground of R or G. Another example involves an event where a specific change in temperature occurs: a reason why this room's temperature changed is that the average kinetic energy changed (29). This change in kinetic energy does not cause the change in temperature because the change in kinetic energy constitutes the change in temperature. There are thus two kinds of reasons why for events that should be distinguished.

Skow aims to defend a strong version of the claim that reasons why events occur are either causes or grounds. To articulate the strength of his account he makes an innovation that also proves crucial to avoiding potential counterexamples to his theory: higher-level reasons why. For any reason why R for an event Q, we can consider the reason why <R is a reason why Q>, where the angle brackets are used merely for readability (38, fn. 25). Why, after all, is R a reason why Q? The fact that R is a reason why Q does not correspond to an event, but Skow's considered theory of reasons why aims to say why this sort of fact obtains, i.e. why these reasons are reasons. His answer is that, necessarily, whenever we have some cause R that is a reason why some event Q occurs, "the reason why <one reason why Q is that R> is that the fact that R is a cause of the fact that Q" (38). A similar principle is presented for grounds: it is in virtue of being a ground for that event that the ground is a reason why for that event. It is not a coincidence that causes and grounds are reasons why, but this instead flows from their nature as causes and grounds. (The phrase "the reason why . . . " is eventually qualified to read "a reason why . . . " for reasons that I do not have space to go into. See section 5.2 on third-level reasons (124).) Skow does not provide direct arguments for this strengthened version of his theory. It is hard to imagine how considerations internal to scientific practice would tell in favor of this version as opposed to some weakened account that allowed reasons why to be reasons why for other sorts of reasons (or for no reason at all). Skow's theory certainly has a kind of metaphysical simplicity that cuts off any further queries concerning reasons why for events, and this is a kind of argument in its favor.

The distinction between first-level and second-level reasons why proves central to Skow's strategy for addressing potential counterexamples. According to Skow, those who maintain that there are reasons for events besides causes and grounds think this mainly because they are confused on levels of reasons. Consider, for example, this dialogue that appears to present a general regularity as a reason why:

A: Why did [i] the rock hit the ground at a speed of 4.4 m/s?
B: It landed at a speed of 4.4 m/s because [ii] it was dropped from 1 meter, and Newton's theory of gravitation entails that, [iii] for short falls, the impact speed s is related to the distance fallen d by the equation s = (2dg), where g is the gravitational acceleration near the surface of the earth. And of course [iv] √ (2 · 1 · 9.8) 4.4 (82, emphasis and numbering added). 

For Skow's theory of reasons why to be correct, the only reason why (i) given in this passage is (ii). This is because neither (iii) nor (iv) are causes or grounds of (i). Skow argues that (iii) is not a reason why (i) using the distinction between a good response to a why question and a partial answer to a why question. B's response is a good response, but that is not due to the fact that (ii), (iii) and (iv) are each partial answers to the original question of why (i). Only (ii) is a partial answer to (i). (iii) is part of a good response to A's question because it is a partial answer to another why question that is naturally related to A's question. A asks why (i), and B anticipates that A would also like to know not only why (i), but also why (ii) is a reason why (i). (iii) is thus offered as a second-level reason why. (Presumably (iv) is offered as a partial answer to another follow-up question: (iv) is a reason why <(iii) is a reason why <(ii) is a reason why (i)>>.)

Skow deploys this maneuver to argue not only against the classic views of Hempel and Salmon, but also to question the popular manipulationist approach to causal explanation championed by Woodward: "the theory is -- I believe -- false, and rests on a confusion of levels of reasons why in much the same way the DN model did forty years earlier" (95). This seems uncharitable. Skow provides no reason to think that Woodward is confused on this point. Instead, there is a substantial and interesting disagreement on reasons why for events. Skow maintains that all reasons why an event occurs are either causes or grounds, and this somehow flows from the natures of causes, grounds and events. Woodward insists that causes are not metaphysically autonomous in this sense: for C to be a cause of E, some other fact must obtain beyond the occurrence of C. Furthermore, it is this other fact that is an essential ingredient in a reason why E occurs. Skow devotes a brief appendix to this issue (100-108), but in my view he does not really grapple with the alternative approach that Woodward has carefully developed. One way to motivate Woodward's position is to adopt a contrastive approach to causal explanation. This is how Hitchcock interprets Woodward (Hitchcock 2013). Skow mentions this possibility, but does not pursue it: "If contrastivism about causation turns out to be correct, then I will advocate contrastivism about reasons why as well" (36). With this shift, Skow's proposal would be that when C rather than C' is a reason why E rather than E', then C rather than C' is a cause (or a ground) of E rather than E'. Woodward's position would mandate that the fact that C rather than C' is not itself a reason in isolation. Instead, only the fact that involved some regularity along with the contrastive fact would count as a reason why. It is not clear to me how to adjudicate this dispute, but again I do not see how it turns on any confusion in levels of reasons why. Woodward is focused on how scientists acquire evidence about the causes of E, and he uses this to inform an account of what it is for something to be a cause of E. If what it is for C to be a cause of E includes not only the occurrence of C, but also some general regularity, then it is perfectly appropriate to make that general regularity part of one of the reasons why E.

Skow also considers several examples of purported non-causal explanations of events, from Sober's classic discussion of equilibrium explanation through Marc Lange's more recent case for "distinctively" mathematical explanations. Each of Skow's responses reveals more about how he is thinking about causes or reasons why. Elliot Sober had claimed that R. A. Fisher's evolutionary explanation for why the ratio of males to females in the current human population is approximately 1:1 is not a causal explanation: "the event would have occurred regardless of which of a variety of causal scenarios actually transpired" (Sober, given at 67). Skow finds some causes in Fisher's explanation using a proportionality test (68) and interprets the rest of Fisher's explanation as helping the receiver of the explanation to recognize that these causes are reasons why, i.e. they are what Skow calls "epistemic enablers" (73).

Lange has presented cases where mathematical facts confer a higher degree of necessity on some physical event than what can be traced to causes and physical laws. So, when these mathematical facts appear in an answer to a why-question, we have a reason why that is non-causal. For example, that someone has 23 strawberries is a non-causal reason why the strawberries cannot be divided evenly, even though the number of strawberries is a cause of this division failure. Skow takes this conclusion to require something like the following overriding claim: even when R is a cause that Q, and R is a reason why Q, R will not be a reason why because it is a cause. This occurs when all the reasons why R is a reason why Q are other sorts of facts, such as mathematical facts or higher order laws (117). Skow questions this position using an elaborate example of "Zeno causality" adapted from John Hawthorne. This possible case is used to find a counterexample to the overriding claim. For in this case, we have a cause that is a reason why because it is a cause even though Lange's supposed overriding conditions are met. The upshot is that Lange has not found a compelling way to motivate a non-causal reason why for an event.

I hope that this compressed survey conveys the contents and flavor of Skow's book. Skow offers an innovative and refreshing intervention in debates about explanation and reasons why. His approach will surely be of interest to those sympathetic to Lewis' work on explanation and to those with a stake in integrating causes and grounds into a coherent metaphysical picture. I have only been able to scratch the surface of a few of Skow's intricate arguments, and reasons of space preclude any engagement with his interesting final chapter on teleological reasons and reasons for intentional action.

Skow's clear focus is on the special sort of fact that "corresponds" to the occurrence of a concrete event. It is natural to wonder why these sorts of facts are special. Why, after all, are all whales mammals? The philosopher of science cannot simply bracket this question as irrelevant to science, so it is puzzling that Skow does not discuss reasons why for these sorts of concrete facts. (There is a brief discussion at 139-140 that seems relevant, but the implications for reasons why for these sorts of facts is not clear to me.) As we have seen, every so often Skow does provide reasons why for facts that do not correspond to concrete events: his own philosophical theory proffers reasons why for families of abstract facts that involve first-level reasons why. Should we go on and say that there is a reason why Skow's theory is true? Philosophers certainly aspire to find reasons why, and so we should either extend Skow's theory to cover such cases or uncover some argument for why this quest for reasons is a kind of error. Skow concludes the book with a few brief remarks about reasons why more generally without taking a position (179).

Skow's theory of reasons why in the world suggests a kind of rational order that is waiting to be uncovered. Many philosophers of science have moved in a different direction, locating some, if not all, of Skow's reasons in cognitive and other anthropocentric domains (Woody 2015, Strevens forthcoming). On this family of approaches, what counts as a genuine explanation or reason why is just as much a function of our characteristics as it is a feature of what is going on in the world as it is independently of us. At a minimum, those skeptical of Skow's unified approach to reasons why should respond by developing an equally polished and compelling alternative.


Hitchcock, C. (2013). "Contrastive explanation." In M. Blaauw (ed.), Contrastivism in Philosophy, Routledge, 11-34.

Strevens, M. (forthcoming). "The mathematical route to causal understanding." In A. Reutlinger & J. Saatsi (eds.), Explanation Beyond Causation, Oxford University Press.

Woody, A. (2015). "Re-orienting discussions of scientific explanation: A functional perspective," Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 52: 79-87.