Reasons without Persons: Rationality, Identity, and Time

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Brian Hedden, Reasons without Persons: Rationality, Identity, and Time, Oxford University Press, 2015, 210pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732594.

Reviewed by Heidi Savage, SUNY Geneseo


This is a well-written, ambitious book that ties disparate strands of philosophy together into a complete picture of what is required for an agent to be rational -- theories of personhood and theories of epistemic and practical rationality. To my knowledge, this is something only Derek Parfit has been successful at tackling thus far. In general, the book is knowledgeable and an interesting read. While these are certainly laudatory features, still, there is room for improvement. For instance, Brian Hedden spends a good amount of time exploring other logically possible views only to dismiss them or to show how his view is consistent with them, when instead he could be more usefully focused on exploring the underlying assumptions of the discourse, and in making tighter and clearer connections in his line of reasoning. That said, the book is recommended reading for anyone interested in the connections between rationality and personal identity, and it is written in a way that makes it accessible to pretty much anyone interested in the topic.

The work is composed of eleven chapters. In the first, Hedden lays out his thesis in programmatic terms. In Chapter 2, he argues in favor of his view based on critiques of theories of personal identity, and in the third chapter he develops his views further, applying his critiques to diachronic principles in general. In Chapter 4, Hedden considers the role of reflection in his own account. Chapter 5 deals with an important objection to Hedden's view. Chapters 6-8 focus on developing the view in more detail, while Chapters 9-10 consider applications of the view to various issues in the theory of rationality. Given length constraints, we can consider the view only in its programmatic form. For that reason, we will be concerned mainly with clarifying the proposal and its consequences.

This review, then, instead of attempting to sketch the entire book and offer some general observations, will be focused on one of the cases Hedden takes to be central for defining his own account. To be frank, the reason for this tack is that I, at least, find the case under-described and therefore what to say about it is unclear. If this is correct, Hedden's later line of reasoning cannot be evaluated properly, at least not until we get clear about the relevant case.

Hedden's target is a particular, natural understanding of what it takes to be a rational agent tout court -- a rational actor and believer, let us say. What is it to be rational? According to Hedden, one definition is that an agent is rational just in case what that agent believes depends upon the evidence they have at hand, and just in case how that agent acts depends upon what that evidence says would lead to the satisfaction of their desires (p. 1).

As it stands, this definition is not agent-neutral or impartial. Notice that what is rational for an agent depends upon what relations that agent stands in with respect to evidence, and on that particular agent's desires.

Hedden claims that it also fails to be time-insensitive. According to him, the previous understanding of rationality suggests that an agent's mental states are unified in some way over time, diachronically -- at least unified enough to allow an agent to perform actions and form beliefs, both of which seem to require time to perform and do. If being rational involves pursuing goals, forming beliefs, making decisions, among other time consuming actions, then a diachronic view of rationality seems unavoidable. For instance, suppose you have the goal of finishing a Bachelor's Degree. In order to do this, you must major in a subject, and complete the relevant course requirements. In order to accomplish this goal, you must decide what major to pursue and then pursue it. All of this takes time and some stable mental intention, plan, or commitment to a certain area of study.

Despite its plausibility, however, Hedden ultimately rejects the idea that being rational entails any form of diachronic unity, and endorses a synchronic, agent-neutral or impartial view, that he calls "Time Slice Rationality." This view has two components. Hedden unpacks it in the following way: if an action or belief is synchronically rational, then it is based only on that agent's occurrent beliefs and desires; if something is a reason for action or belief for all agents, then it is a reason for any agent. For Hedden, to be a rational agent does not depend upon your particular desires, nor does it depend upon any time-sensitive perspective; there is no difference between intrapersonal constraints on rationality and interpersonal constraints on rationality. On the Time Slice Rationality view, nothing distinguishes constraints on an agent's rationality simply in virtue of the fact that some time slice in the future will be identical to their current time slice. Correlatively, all current time slices of all persons are subject to the same constraints on their respective rational capacities.

But how does Hedden account for desires being aimed at satisfaction if we are looking only at time slices of agents, and not at an agent over time? Well, there is nothing on his account that rules out agents having future-oriented desires at a given moment. And, these kinds of desires count when assessing an agent's rational capacities. What does not count are actual future desires. And this seems plausible. After all, requiring an agent to take account of all of her potential future desires when in the process of decision-making would nigh make being rational an impossible state to achieve. At any rate, it is not even clear why an agent, knowing her future desires, ought to pay them any heed whatsoever, since by definition, they cannot be part of her current motivational states, and only existent motivational states can motivate or count as motives for action.

To get a grip on how Hedden's view works, let us return to our student example, an example that figures prominently in clarifying the nature of Hedden's view in contrast with the opposing view. Consider a student we'll call "Capricious Carrie."[1] Capricious Carrie does not know what she wants to pursue in college. One day she wishes to be a doctor, the next a journalist, and then finally a biologist. This changing of Capricious Carrie's desires continues throughout her academic studies, and none of them occur due to any particular reasons directed at her feelings or beliefs about these subjects. She just simply changes her mind. Of course, as we all know, Capricious Carrie will never finish her degree if she does not finish any requirements to complete a major, and her shifting desires compromise this. According to Hedden, Carrie is not rational on the natural, or diachronic, understanding of rationality. But, according to Hedden, while the natural understanding of rationality can get the right result here -- the student is not acting rationally -- so too can his own theory. And, since the diachronic understanding is mistaken, Hedden's explanation is better than the alternative.

On the natural diachronic understanding of what makes Carrie irrational, it is the fact that she has good evidence concerning what is required to complete her degree, she has the desire to do so, and yet she fails to maintain an attitude stable enough to satisfy that desire. On Hedden's view, however, the explanation cannot be that Carrie fails to maintain a stable enough attitude to satisfy her desire to get a degree. Instead, we look at whether any given time slice of that agent is rational. Given that Carrie has occurrent future oriented desires to get a degree, and yet her current desire about what course of study to pursue is unsettled, for Hedden, she fails to be rational in taking the means to achieve the goal of getting a degree.[2] Her unsettled desires do not mesh with her occurrent future oriented desires.

This shows at least that Hedden can accommodate the lack of rationality in the previous case without appeal to time-sensitivity. Now how is the agent-neutral aspect applied to this case? Presumably, it would be applied as follows: objectively speaking, if all agents getting a degree must choose a major to achieve their ends, then Carrie too must do so, and therefore anything she does that fails to comport with this dictum is irrational.

But now let's examine whether Hedden's explanation is entirely satisfactory. The case is not one in which Carrie cannot decide at a given time what she wants to pursue. Rather, it is a case of shifting desires over time. This means that at any given time, her desires are in fact determinate. On Tuesday, let us say, she wants to major in philosophy, and this desire is perfectly consistent with her future oriented desire to get a degree. If this is right, Hedden then does not get the result he was seeking -- that of judging Carrie irrational on his own theory, since each time slice of Capricious Carrie is rational at a given moment. Furthermore, this would seem to hold for any agent facing a situation in which there are myriad ways to achieve a goal, and therefore, their desires, at any given moment, are not irrational by these lights either. Therefore, Hedden's Time Slice Rationality Theory leaves with no account of why Capricious Carrie is irrational.

Perhaps, however, this is as it should be. After all, what is wrong with changing one's mind about one's major on a daily basis? So long as it comes to an end at some point and a major is chosen, it would seem that the answer is "nothing." Perhaps it is exactly here that Hedden ought to dig in his heels and argue that his view is actually more plausible for this very reason, and is in fact one of its distinguishing features.

Someone who holds a diachronic view might object to this consequence, since if Carrie continuously does this over time, she will not in fact attain her degree, and therefore she would not be rational at all with respect to her goal of getting a degree. Hedden at this point would have to answer the question of what explains this intuition, since as we've seen, Time Slice Rationality cannot count Carrie at any given point as irrational, and this seems unfortunate. To me, however, it is just not obvious that any failure to obtain a goal ought to be attributed to a failure of rationality, or whether to simply attribute it to a failure to have some other kind of character trait.

For example, imagine I fail to attain my goal of becoming a race car driver because I just lack the skills necessary to be a race car driver. Or imagine I fail to achieve my stated goal of quitting smoking because my occurrent desires to smoke a single cigarette consistently win out. These cases, of course, appear to be very different. No one would claim that I was irrational in my failure to become a race car driver, but some would maintain that my continued smoking is irrational. Still, I am not convinced that this is the correct intuition to have about these cases, precisely because of one of the issues raised in Hedden's work. To wit, whether we ought to be prudent, or future directed in our aims and goals, or whether our desires at a time ought to outweigh more future-oriented desires. One of the issues that needs to be settled when we see a failure of long-term goal achievement on the part of an agent, is whether we should conclude that that agent lacks rationality, or draw another conclusion. For instance, we might think that Capricious Carrie is not irrational, but perhaps lacks some other character trait, that of decisiveness. Likewise, in the case of my failure to quit smoking, we might conclude that I lack the character trait of being able to delay gratification, but again, it is not clear that this makes me irrational. In conclusion, before we can properly evaluate a diachronic or synchronic view of rationality, we need to settle what certain cases tell us about its nature. I suspect, however, that a synchronic view, a view that makes rationality a thinner concept is likely to be more successful in allowing us to make these distinctions, which Hedden's view is clearly primed to do.

[1] This is only one of the cases Hedden relies on to distinguish his view from the opposing view. This one concerns practical rationality. The other concerns epistemic rationality and involves a named character Fickle Frank. In the interests of fairness to fictional characters, although Hedden fails to name the character in the second case, I have chosen to name her "Capricious Carrie."

[2] Note that I am not entirely sure that this is accurate to Hedden's explanation of the case. Another way Hedden explains Carrie's irrationality is that her desires about what major to choose are not, at any given time, directed by her goal of pursuing her degree. Her desires are not aimed at satisfying her goals and are not directed by her goals. Yet another way Hedden characterizes Carrie's irrationality is that her occurrent desires do not depend upon anything grounded in the reality of her situation, or on any of her other mental states. That is, her desires even at a time do not cohere with any of her other desires or beliefs. As we might now suspect, the case, as it stands, is under-described, and therefore I do not believe that either way of understanding what is occurring in it is warranted. Simply not knowing what major to pursue, or simply changing one's mind about which one to pursue does not mean that such mental states are not goal-determined. It might simply mean that there are a multitude of ways to satisfy that goal and each desire is itself determined by having that goal. And, the second explanation is far too vague as it stands, and any precisification I have thought of seems patently false.