Reassessing Egalitarianism

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Jeremy Moss, Reassessing Egalitarianism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 180pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137385970.

Reviewed by David A. Reidy, University of Tennessee


In this book, Jeremy Moss introduces readers to much of the canonical literature in mainstream political philosophy concerning the nature and value of equality as a substantive political commitment. By equality, he means not formal equality or equality of standing (though of course he is committed to each), but rather substantive equality or equality of condition or lived experience along some salient metric. A person's political commitments are egalitarian in the sense that Moss undertakes to examine only to the extent that they include a commitment to the value of equality in this latter substantive sense.

The first question Moss takes up is how those of us who value substantive equality in political life in fact value it. Worries about the apparent irrationality of leveling down for the sake of substantive equality as well as about the superior intuitive plausibility of sufficientarian and/or prioritarian views of what we really care about when we seem to care about substantive equality lead him to conclude that substantive equality is not likely intrinsically valuable in and of itself, at least in political life. Of course, it is often instrumentally valuable as a means, sometimes a necessary means, to some other independent political good, for example, an enduring social stability that does not depend on force, manipulation, deception, or similar mechanisms. But this way of valuing substantive equality leaves it always potentially vulnerable. When it is but one of several candidate means to an independent good, it is vulnerable to being traded off against other means. When it is a necessary means, it is vulnerable to being traded off against or subordinated to some other good greater or weightier than that for which it is a necessary means. If substantive equality is always only instrumentally valuable, then egalitarianism does not pick out a particularly distinctive orientation to political life.

Moss aims to move past this standoff between "either we value substantive equality intrinsically in and for itself (which seems implausible) or we value it instrumentally as a means to other independent political ends (which doesn't seem distinctively egalitarian)". He does so by siding with those who argue that substantive equality is often an essential ingredient or aspect of -- an internal component of, and not merely a separate, external, even if necessary, means to -- some independent good that is in fact intrinsically valuable in itself. Fairness, democracy, political autonomy, freedom, justice, self-development, and/or amour propre are all candidate great and weighty goods that we value intrinsically. Yet substantive equality in some sense is arguably a constitutive ingredient or essential aspect of what we value in each case, an internal component and not merely a separate, external, even if necessary, means. So, insofar as we value any of these things intrinsically, we value substantive equality in some respect or other intrinsically and non-instrumentally -- not in itself, of course, but as an essential ingredient in something we do value in itself. The upshot is that those of us who value substantive equality, in some respect or other, likely value it instrumentally and, more importantly, intrinsically, though probably not in itself.

The second question Moss takes up concerns the dimension or dimensions of our condition or lived experience with respect to which substantive equality matters and so is measured in political life. Of course, as instrumentally valued, substantive equality might matter for a wide range of reasons and in a great number of ways and so might be properly examined and measured along any number of dimensions of our condition or lived experience. Everything here will depend on the contingent instrumental relations between substantive equality and the ends for which it is a means. Philosophical reflection is not likely to be able to contribute much here. But as intrinsically or non-instrumentally valued, as partly constitutive of other great weighty political goods intrinsically valued, substantive equality is likely to matter for a narrower range of reasons and in fewer, less deeply contingent, ways. Here one might expect philosophical reflection to have something to offer in terms of picking out the dimension or dimensions of our condition or lived experience with respect to which substantive equality matters and so is measured in political life.

Moss organizes his discussion here as a survey of the now familiar "equality of what?" debate, taking stock of canonical welfarist, resourcist and capabilities positions. He ably reviews the adaptive preference and expensive taste objections to welfarist views, the disability objections to resourcist views, and the publicity and illiberal perfectionist objections to capabilities views. And he helpfully notes a number of instances in which what divides these views is less than what might at first appear and in which the "equality of what?" debate has accordingly unfolded at cross purposes. For example, notwithstanding much that is said within the debate, all three views take freedom and preferences seriously. Moss concludes by suggesting that if we are to advance this debate we would do well to work toward a more substantive (e.g., outcome rather than opportunity) combined/pluralist metric for assessing substantive inequalities.

In one sense this is no doubt the right conclusion. If we value substantive equality intrinsically only insofar as it is partly constitutive of other goods we value intrinsically in political life, it seems unlikely that we will able to avoid appealing to some combined/pluralist metric (really multiple metrics) for assessing substantive inequalities. It would be astounding if regardless of the particular intrinsic value of which substantive equality was partly constitutive it always mattered along the same dimension of our condition or lived experience. It would be equally astounding if at least sometimes, along some dimensions, equal opportunity was not enough and that outcomes really did matter.

But in another sense this conclusion misses the mark. Suppose we are concerned with substantive equality as a constitutive ingredient or essential aspect of a basic social structure organized as a fair system of production/distribution. Plausibly we will reject many substantive inequalities, whether in the powers, opportunities or the typical rate of distributive return for productive input, associated with the offices and positions constituting the system of production/distribution. We will certainly reject those that are not mutually advantageous and perhaps those that do not contribute to maximally improving the least advantaged offices and positions. But these will be only a small subset of the substantive inequalities that will inevitably characterize the lived experiences of the many distinct individuals occupying these offices and positions at any given time. Whether and how someone concerned, say as a matter of social justice/structural fairness, with substantive inequalities ingredient in the configuration of offices and positions constituting the basic social structure is thereby, or ought to be, concerned with any of the substantive inequalities belonging to this latter, much larger, set is not at all obvious.

Of course, some substantive inequalities belonging to this latter, much larger, set may (no doubt often do) matter for some reason(s) other than realizing a society structurally organized as a fair system of production/distribution. But insofar as they do, there is no obvious reason to think that the metric (say, resourcist or primary goods) appropriate to assessing structural inequalities within the system of production/distribution will be the appropriate metric for assessing them. Further, given that we care about both structural and interpersonal and transactional substantive inequalities, and care about them as partially constitutive of diverse goods intrinsically valued, we are more likely to move toward a clarified understanding of our commitments to substantive equality by trying to clarify the relative location and weight of these values (not only the aforementioned fairness, political autonomy, self-development, democracy, freedom, amour propre, etc., but also decency, care, redress, interpersonal and transactional justice, and so on) within an overall social ideal than by struggling to determine "the" metric (inevitably increasingly complex) for properly assessing substantive inequalities across all the domains in which they matter to us intrinsically. No doubt Moss has something like this thought in mind when he urges egalitarians to explore more complex/pluralist answers to the "equality of what?" question. But the point never comes through clearly and the reader is left thinking, incorrectly in my view, that we are likely to make progress by approaching the "equality of what?" question as a single question. If there is progress to be made by pursuing a single question, it is the "what is our overall social ideal?" question.

Of course, as those familiar with the "equality of what?" debate know, personal responsibility and the associated choice/chance distinction has become a central concern. Egalitarians of various sorts have been eager to defend themselves against various charges from the right -- for example, that they are engaged in a politics of envy, have made a fetish of equality, or have abandoned traditional notions of desert -- by insisting that they are not concerned with substantive inequalities best explained in terms of choices or for which persons are responsible. Accordingly, Moss devotes his third chapter to luck egalitarianism and its relational egalitarian critics.

Luck egalitarians concern themselves with substantive inequalities arising out of brute luck and for which persons are not responsible. Relational egalitarians concern themselves with substantive inequalities in the structural relations constituting the social positions from which persons engage one another in social life. Luck and relational egalitarians both include proponents of welfarist, resourcist and capability metrics. And they both range over different views regarding the intrinsic good or goods of which substantive equality is an ingredient and thus in terms of which they explain their concern for substantive equality. To cut through some of this complexity, Moss notes that both luck and relational egalitarians agree that choice and responsibility matter. When they disagree, it is over when and how they matter. Relational egalitarians will hold that given fair background conditions substantive inequalities arising out of choice or chance matter only insofar as they compromise fair background conditions. Luck egalitarians will hold, or at least seem often to hold, that substantive inequalities arising out of brute chance matter even when background conditions are fair and that substantive inequalities arising out of choices do not matter even when they compromise fair background conditions.

Moss expresses some sympathy for a relational view, noting not only that there is little reason to worry about substantive inequalities in the allocation of jobs arising out of brute luck provided the allocations are made within a context of fair equality of opportunity, but also that the larger ideal of immunizing persons from the adverse consequences of brute luck is probably incoherent and not particularly attractive. But Moss misses an opportunity to clarify a "debate" by drawing attention to the distinction between identifying certain contingent "morally arbitrary" facts as incapable of justifying structural substantive inequalities (those ingredient in the field within which choice and chance ultimately shape the condition and lived experience of individuals) and treating as problematic substantive inequalities in the condition or lived experience of actual individuals just in case brute luck plays a prominent role in their best explanation. This is in a way surprising since he plausibly traces the luck/relational egalitarian divide to alternative readings of Rawls's claim that desert claims cannot figure as premises in an account of structural or social justice. The Rawlsian suggestion is that structural or social justice (fair background conditions) positions persons such that they have no valid complaints against one another based on substantive inequalities arising downstream, whether out of choice or chance. We may, of course, individually regret our choices or be disappointed by our bad luck. But we have no complaint against others. What luck egalitarians need to explain is not why we are troubled by substantive inequalities arising from chance given the unfair background conditions of our existing world, nor why we are individually often disappointed by our bad brute luck, but why we should all care about substantive inequalities arising between us out of brute luck even when background conditions are fair. To be sure, there may sometimes be (no doubt in fact sometimes are) reasons to care about such inequalities. But what we need here is to understand these reasons and their place within an overall social ideal according to which certain contingent facts are morally irrelevant to the determination of structural or social justice, not a finer grained understanding of the choice/chance distinction in relation to substantive equality.

Moss seems to be on to all this when he insightfully notes that the attention over the last few decades consumed by the luck/relational egalitarian debate and the attendant choice/chance distinction has unhelpfully distracted egalitarian political philosophers from the most serious and troubling causes of substantive inequality: unfair trade and labor practices, discrimination, failures to secure levels of public health and education essential to meaningful equality of opportunity and so on. But with his attention primarily fixed on substantive inequalities between actual distinct individuals, he never quite engages with the Rawlsian thought that if we were to eliminate unfair trade and labor practices, overcome discrimination, secure adequate public health and education, and so on (including constitutionalizing and maintaining fair value for political liberties), we might find that our concern with the substantive inequalities that will, often purely through brute luck, inevitably continue to characterize and shape the condition and lived experience of actual persons arises, within an overall social ideal, only downstream from first principles of justice.

In his final chapter, Moss asks whether and how we ought to extend our substantive egalitarian political commitments, whatever they turn out to be after careful consideration of the issues raised in the three preceding chapters, beyond the domain of national politics to the domain of international and/or global politics. He conjectures that luck egalitarians are naturally prone to a straightforward extension here since the nation (and so anticipated standard of living, etc.) into which one is born is clearly a matter of brute luck, while relational egalitarians will remain skeptical since within the international or global context persons do not stand in the sorts of relations that would trigger a concern for substantive inequalities of condition or lived experience. Moss is eager here to show that relational egalitarians ought to extend their concern with substantive inequalities to the international or global context. He examines three reasons relational egalitarians might invoke to confine their substantive egalitarianism to the sphere of domestic national politics: the absence of an international cooperative system of production/distribution within which a commitment to fairness or reciprocity might find a toe-hold; the relatively diminished impacts of any extant international/global basic structure on the condition and lived experience of individuals relative to the impacts of their home state's basic structure; and the absence of an international legal/political order with a monopoly on coercion analogous to the monopoly enjoyed in the domestic sphere by the legal/political order of individual nation states. Moss plausibly argues that each fails as a reason for relational egalitarians to resist extending substantive egalitarian commitments to the global or international order. Accordingly, both luck and relational egalitarians ought to extend their concern with substantive inequalities to the international or global order. Of course, none of this engages Rawlsian relational egalitarians for whom commitments to substantive equality are rooted in and shaped by an antecedent commitment to structurally realizing a social world of reciprocal relations between persons, both as citizens within just polities and as well-ordered polities within a just society of peoples.

Moss ends by taking a look at how those inclined to extend substantive egalitarian concern to the international or global arena might address two pressing issues: global poverty and economic inequality, on the one hand, and inequalities in the distribution of costs and benefits associated with greenhouse gas emissions and their environmental impacts, including climate change, on the other. With respect to the former, he examines various views regarding command over and possible redistributions of natural resources or a portion of their market value. With respect to the latter, he examines various putatively egalitarian ways of structuring a global carbon budget. But the discussion here functions primarily as a kind of coda offered to demonstrate the practical relevance of all that precedes it. Those eager for a sharpened and deeper understanding of the most productive directions for progressive policy advances in these areas would do well to look elsewhere, including to Moss's other work, for a more extended treatment.

A few final observations. First, I found it remarkable that there is no sustained discussion of democracy or of what it would mean to secure fair value for the democratic political liberties or substantive equality in the condition or lived experience of democratic citizens in their roles as the basic officeholders or political agents in a democracy. Given the historical linkage between the emergence of democratic aspirations in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries and the widespread "new liberal" concern with moving past formal equality and so with substantive inequalities, this is a striking omission. To be sure, in his first chapter Moss includes democracy in his list of values an essential or constitutive ingredient of which might be substantive equality. But he never returns to or explores the thought. Second, I found it remarkable that there is almost no discussion of the ways in which cultural forms, including those associated with gender, race and other widely shared economies of desire entrenched in civil society, etc., underwrite important substantive inequalities in the condition or lived experience of persons. Feminist, race and disability theorists are not part of the conversation Moss assesses (though Elizabeth Anderson appears in the discussion of luck and relational egalitarianism, and Martha Nussbaum appears in the discussion of capabilities metrics of equality). Third, I found it remarkable that important limits on substantive egalitarian concern for the international or global domain were left unmentioned. For example, it is virtually impossible to imagine how to extend equality of opportunity internationally or globally in the absence of something like a world state and open borders, a nonstarter for the foreseeable future. And in the absence of equality of opportunity, it is not obvious how far we can reasonably extend other substantive egalitarian commitments internationally or globally.

Moss has written a clear, informed and engaging volume that will be of value to those eager to get a feel for a substantial portion of an important set of debates of concern to substantive egalitarians. He has shed a good deal of light. The volume is well-suited to advanced undergraduates and graduate students or others orienting themselves to the existing landscape. But those eager to push forward will need also to bring a torch of their own.