Receptions of Descartes: Cartesianism and anti-Cartesianism in Early Modern Europe

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Tad Schmaltz (ed.), Receptions of Descartes: Cartesianism and anti-Cartesianism in Early Modern Europe, Routledge, 2005, 272pp., $96.95 (hbk), ISBN 0415323606.

Reviewed by J.G. Cottingham, The University of Reading


It is a notoriously uphill task to sell multi-authored collections of papers to publishers, and this is particularly true of volumes of conference proceedings. Publishers' advisors invariably (and not unreasonably) expect volumes to have the kind of clear thematic unity that seldom emerges when a group of individual historical scholars, working away in their own specialist niches, are invited to talk under a wide general rubric. The rubric chosen in this case -- 'Cartesianism and anti-Cartesianism in early modern Europe' -- casts the net so widely that an extremely heterogeneous catch is all but inevitable.

The dozen papers included in this volume could hardly be more diverse. Part One comprises a single isolated paper on Anne Conway and Princess Elizabeth. Part Two covers Desgabets on indefectibility, Malebranche on Cartesian morality, Huet on doubt, and Regis on freedom -- topics linked not so much by any commonality of subject-matter as by the fact that the writers discussed are French. Part Three takes us to discussions of substance by some lesser known Dutch thinkers, de Volder and Wittich, much of whose work relates more closely to Spinoza than to Descartes. Part Four moves to Catholic theology in Italy, and some familiar tensions between Cartesian philosophy and the doctrine of the Eucharist, while Part Five discusses critiques of Cartesian physics by two British thinkers, More and Glanville, together with a comparative study of the views of Descartes and Locke on the theory of vision.

If one has to acknowledge the zeal of the editor Tad Schmaltz in getting this extraordinarily mixed bag past the assessors at Routledge, he is less to be commended for allowing his volume to be marred by an awkward and unhelpful referencing system. To refer to Anne Conway's Principles as 'Conway 1996', or Hobbes's Leviathan as 'Hobbes 1991', is surely a grotesque way to designate seventeenth-century works -- especially when no precise indication of the actual date of original composition or publication is given either in the text or in the bibliography. There are many suitable ways of indicating both the original date and the date of the modern edition or translation used for page references, and historians of philosophy should be giving a lead here in resisting the spread of a reference system that may be appropriate for modern science journals but which was never really suited to the humanities.

In his admirably concise introduction, Schmaltz guides the reader through the volume's contents, and questions Descartes's own presentation of his system as a 'complete and seamless whole'; studying the different receptions of his work discloses instead its 'open-ended and multi-layered nature'. These alternatives perhaps need not be mutually exclusive, since presumably a philosophical system may have a genuine unity, even though that unity is subsequently dismantled under the influence of later interpreters and commentators. An issue arises here about whether we shed more light on the thought of a great philosopher by striving to get back to the original texts, viewing them in the context of the author's own intentions (so far as we can discover them) and the intellectual milieu in which he operated, or whether we can discover more by seeing what was made of those writings by subsequent defenders and critics. Schmaltz, perhaps wisely, does not offer a view on this matter, but contents himself with the uncontroversial conclusion that whichever of the two approaches we take will 'make a difference' to the way we understand the history of early modern philosophy.

Questions of perspective come to a head in one of the most interesting papers in the volume, Thomas Lennon's study of the nature of Cartesian doubt. Much analytic philosophy over the past fifty years has agonized over the scope and coherence of Descartes's method of doubt, but this piece focuses on the rather different issue of its seriousness or sincerity. Descartes himself 'seemed to want it both ways', Lennon reminds us. He described his First Meditation argument about the possibility of wholesale divinely-induced deception as 'not flippant or ill-considered' but 'based on powerful and well thought-out reasons'; but on the other hand he described the doubt so induced as 'hyperbolical', and remarked (in the Synopsis to the Meditations) that 'no sane person' has ever doubted that there is an external world, or that people have bodies. Pierre-Daniel Huet's Censura philosophiae Cartesiana of 1689 ('the most comprehensive, unrelenting and devastating reception Descartes's philosophy ever received') fastened on this ambivalence and elaborated it into a destructive dilemma: if the doubt is real and genuine, it is philosophically unanswerable; if it is unreal, it is insincere and dishonest. Lennon raises the question of whether the dilemma might be evaded by construing the doubt simply as a premise in the reductio of scepticism; this would make the doubt a genuine theoretical supposition, but would not, as it were, endorse or advocate it as such. Whether Huet has the resources to respond to this move is something Lennon does not adjudicate in this paper. But the issue of sincerity is nonetheless a fascinating one, which seems to carry important lessons for the conduct of present-day epistemology, whose practitioners cheerfully construct intricate arguments attributed to 'the sceptic' or 'the anti-sceptic', with what seems like a cavalier insouciance as to whether the positions so elaborated have ever been real options for human beings outside the seminar room.

Despite all the painstaking scholarly scrutiny that is lavished on them, most of the figures discussed in this volume are, for good reason, not in the 'canon' of great philosophers: their ideas tend to be derivative rather than original contributions to philosophical understanding. An exception is Benedict Spinoza, who is the subject of a thoughtful essay by Stephen Nadler entitled 'Descartes's Soul, Spinoza's Mind.' In the context of a 'receptions' volume, the key question is whether Spinoza should be construed as a 'completer' or a 'destroyer' of the Cartesian system. Nadler opts for the latter construal, taking Spinoza's rejection of Descartes's mind-body dualism as his focus. Other commentators have seen the reasons for this rejection as having to do with intractable problems about the interaction of mind and body in Descartes, or problems about how he can account for the unity of the person. Nadler, however, puts the primary weight on the question of the immortality of the soul. Descartes claimed his dualistic arguments supported the Christian doctrine of immortality, but it is 'absolutely clear' according to Nadler, that Spinoza intends to deny the personal immortality of the soul. Spinoza's parallelism between the attributes of extension and thought, and their respective modes, means that 'when the body goes, there are no more sensory states.' Spinoza does insist that 'something of the mind remains which is eternal', but this 'something' turns out to be the idea which 'expresses the essence of the body under a species of eternity.' Yet there can be nothing personal about such an idea; it is, as Nadler puts it, 'only the correlate in Thought of a ratio of motion and rest in Extension' -- in other words, it is something far too general and abstract to have anything much to do with me, the individual self whose future survival or demise is in question.

This seems to me correct -- but (pace Nadler) not enough to decide the question of whether Spinoza's philosophy 'completes' or 'destroys' that of Descartes. For Descartes himself had attributed sensory states not to the incorporeal mind, but to the 'substantial union' of mind and body; so in the Cartesian system too what remains after the destruction of the body will not be sensory ideas, but only intellectual ones -- yet there is a serious problem about how the latter could be sufficient for personal individuation. The fact that Descartes did not confront this problem (but on the contrary tried to insist that his own system bolstered belief in individual immortality) does not alter the fact that the philosophical resources of his system turn out under scrutiny to be inadequate to underwrite a future for the individual mind after death. Nadler aptly points out that 'the eternity of the mind held out by Spinoza will seem a very thin and disappointing recompense for having lived a life of good'; but this result seems less a consequence of Spinoza's rejection of Descartes than a re-surfacing of problems already inherent in Descartes's acknowledgement of an essential corporeal component in the ordinary human sensory experience -- the experience on which virtually all of our sense of self depends.

There is no space here to discuss the other essays in this volume, which feature work by some very distinguished contributors, including Sarah Hutton, Theo Verbeek, and Jean-Robert Armogathe. The collection may range over an indigestibly large menu of topics and problems, but the scholarly standard throughout is high, and those with a taste for following the fine detail in the history of ideas, as well as for treading some of its lesser known byways, will find much to interest them.