Reckoning with the Imagination: Wittgenstein and the Aesthetics of Literary Experience

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Charles Altieri, Reckoning with the Imagination: Wittgenstein and the Aesthetics of Literary Experience, Cornell University Press, 2015, 262pp., $28.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780801456701.

Reviewed by Wolfgang Huemer, Università di Parma


In this book, Charles Altieri opts for a strategy that might seem original and courageous to some, but problematic or even hopeless to others: he sets out to "restate many of the arguments by Kant, by Schiller, and by Hegel -- on imagination, on aesthetic judgment, on purposiveness, and on the relation between subject and substance . . . reformulating these concepts on a reading of Wittgenstein" (vii) so as to make them more accessible for contemporary readers. Altieri, to be sure, is not interested in offering a lesson in the history of philosophy. He does not run the danger of getting lost in exegetical annotations on the works of German idealist philosophers, nor does he aim to propagate a new interpretation of Wittgenstein's thought. Nor, for that matter, does he make any effort to trace the historical connections between the two positions, to contrast them by highlighting analogies or differences, or to reconstruct what Wittgenstein might have -- or should have -- thought about Kant, Schiller or Hegel. He limits himself to admitting that "There probably cannot be two philosophers more distant from one another" (110) than Hegel and Wittgenstein. 

It is not by accident that at one point in the introduction Altieri speaks of 'his' Wittgenstein, when he says: "My Wittgenstein understands better than any other philosopher how to frame the limitations of our discourses about knowledge without resorting to any kind of scepticism" (p. viii): Altieri picks elements of Wittgenstein's philosophy he finds most interesting -- in particular his observations on avowals and on aspect-seeing -- and assembles them so as to create a framework into which to transpose some selected concepts that were developed by German idealist philosophers. In this way Altieri hopes to "purge" (cf. 107) them from their idealist implications, intending to explore how to state differently conceptions that ought not to be dismissed, but were presented in ways that do not meet "our criteria for effective philosophical argument" (98). (Incidentally, Altieri seems to take for granted that Wittgenstein currently enjoys a better reputation among contemporary philosophers and critics than Kant, Schiller, and Hegel; I wish I could share this optimism).

The strategy is justified by its success. Altieri effectively develops a powerful and engaging perspective on literature, or better, on the value of the many activities and social practices that involve in some way or other literary works of art.

A good deal of the recent discussion in the philosophy of literature focuses on questions concerning the ontological status of fictional entities and how we relate to them, on the worldliness and cognitive value of (fictional) literature, i.e., the question of how literary works of art can contribute to our knowledge or make propositional truths emerge; how it can conform -- to use Altieri's words -- to the "epistemic protocols derived from Enlightenment schema for how to represent knowledge" (100). Moreover, philosophers typically discuss a very one-sided selection of literary works, focusing mainly on works of narrative fiction. In this way, the philosophy of literature runs the risk of treating literary works of art like dead agglomerations of symbols that lack extra-linguistic reference; literature is reduced to a mere ornamental function, it becomes isolated from 'real life,' "a formal cocoon, protected from the messiness of life." (6). In consequence, it becomes difficult to address the questions that should be central to every theoretical reflection on literature: why does literature matter? What is its value for our life?

In Altieri's Wittgensteinian perspective literature is not an isolated manipulation of symbols -- it is not separated or distanced from everyday life. "The skills we need to engage art objects are the same skills we need to negotiate the many interpretive situations we encounter in our daily lives." (6) Literature, thus, is not alien to our concerns -- from the most banal to the existential ones -- or a source of escapist pleasure in which to take refuge from the unpleasantness of the real. It is rather tightly woven into it and therefore "cannot avoid participating in struggles to align and to resist the forms of behavior that we come to understand through speech acts." (6)

Altieri focuses on the dynamic aspects of literature, which he understands as an activity, or better, as a series of interwoven activities. He puts emphasis on the moment of making, in which authors look for a form of expression; on the moment of reading, in which readers attune themselves to the work. And he always takes for granted that all activities of engaging with literature are both a source of delight and hard work. Rather than conceiving it as a mere pastime or idle ornament, he develops a picture that allows us to understand literature as an occasion for an encounter between persons. This stands in direct contrast to the widespread tendency to treat texts as objects rather than works. He writes:

I argue instead that only a language of authorial actions responsible for composing worlds that we see into is adequate to describe how literary imaginations create. And only that perspective will afford sufficient contexts for us to appreciate why we have such a complicated and multitextured vocabulary for responding to works of art. (20)

Some readers might sense a falling back into an intentionalist position that had been exorcised from literary theory a long time ago. The recoil from an understanding that was based on very problematic conceptions of intentions as private mental episodes has brought us to a point where philosophers are more likely to "concentrate on the world presented [in a text] rather than on the author presenting." (154) Altieri does not reduce literature to the description of (fictional) characters or events (of dubious ontological status) or the development of a plot, but he also avoids understanding it as a description of private, inner episodes. A literary work of art could not exist if it was not for the conscious choices of its author, but that does not mean that intentions should play a substantial role in criticism:

intentions have to be displayed -- not explained", and the "relevant intentionality is established simply when the author signs a work . . . For that signature in effect indicates that there has been a carefulness in making decisions that stage responsibility toward what the audience might expect of a work of art. (35)

When drawing our attention back on the moment of making and the imaginative creativity of the author, Altieri avoids the pitfalls of intentionalism on the basis of the German idealist notion of expression -- transposed into a Wittgensteinian framework by building on the latter's notion of avowals. When someone utters sentences like "I am in pain", Wittgenstein has famously argued, she typically does not describe, but expresses her present sensation. Along similar lines, utterances in literary works of art can be seen as expressions of a state of mind -- they do not necessarily express a present sensation or mental episode the author experiences in the moment of writing, but dramatize and so display a possible state of mind or perspective. For Altieri, thus, expressions are dramatized versions of avowals: while "Avowals present states of the self; expressions dramatize them by making manifest and coming to possess certain important properties that the self can be presented as undergoing." (25)

This shift regarding the role of the author is mirrored on the side of the reader. If an author's utterances are construed as analogous to the logic of avowals, their primary function is not to communicate information but rather to display dramatized states of the subject, often with the intention to evoke a reaction. Literary texts, particularly those that are crafted in a skillful manner, guide the reader not to focus on the information contained in the text (on fictional scenarios or persons), but rather to react to aspects that are displayed in the text -- and that become foregrounded by the author's choices at different levels, ranging from syntactic features to the selection of represented scenarios:

When we read responsively, . . . we enact what I call a constant process of valuation. We try to participate in how texts engage our affective lives. We come to treasure what we see as achievements in the text -- in maintaining our interests, in cleverly manipulating the actions, in directing our interests to fresh perceptions and sensitive formulations of attitudes. (12f)

 Altieri, thus, does not situate the power of literature on an epistemic level, but rather on the level of participation: a literary work of art evokes a reaction from the reader by inviting us to participate in what is displayed in the text. With this Altieri proposes a shift "from epistemic and instrumental analyses by critics to a complex network of readerly orientations involving attunement, participation, appreciation, and valuing as modes of reflexive judgment appropriate to an investment in how expressive behaviors engage their worlds" (12).

Altieri, thus, draws our attention to the aesthetic dimension of literary works of art -- a dimension that is often marginalized in the philosophy of literature. In fact, he puts a strong emphasis on the role values and valuing play in our engagement with literature. He does, however, resist the temptation to functionalize this dimension of values by arguing that literature can play a fundamental role in enhancing our moral understanding. Ironizing the closing line of Cavell's Claim of Reason, he states: "My concern is whether literature can concede to philosophical modes of characterizing value and still know itself as a distinct activity." (175). Insisting on the role literature can play for our moral understanding would shift the topic: rather than reflecting literary works of art, we would discuss moral philosophy.

Against this tendency Altieri insists that literature invites in practices of valuing and appreciation. For him, appreciation is not a moment of silent admiring, but a complex and variegated activity -- an activity that seems to be an end in itself, and not a means to enhance our moral understanding or add to our knowledge: "The figure of the appreciator . . . promises to be a worthy counterpart to our intellectual culture's heroizing of the knower" (198). For this reason, Altieri opts to give what he calls a phenomenological analysis of appreciation:

Full valuing requires a roughly phenomenological mode of self-reflection. That is, we engage not only the text but also this sense of who we become by virtue of the qualities of our attention to the text and to what the text mediates as possible worlds. Valuing is a mode of focusing on how the self can attune to what is at stake in imagined situations so that it feels its own capacities to realize dimensions of experience that would otherwise simply be given as aspects of objective situations. (181f)

This is a fascinating book. Unlike what the subtitle might make us expect, its power does not lie primarily in the original use of Wittgenstein in the context of aesthetical theory, nor to the adaption of conceptions borrowed from German idealism, but rather in the perspective on literature that emerges from the text. Altieri draws our attention to central characteristics of literary works of art -- the aesthetic dimension, the dynamic aspects, the dimensions of expression and attunement -- that are often overlooked in the recent debate. It adds substantially to the book that Altieri shows his talent as a fine critic by developing his line of reasoning with analyses of a considerable number of literary works. To close this review on a personal note, I would like to add that reading Altieri's book, I was deeply impressed by the fact that it expresses and displays -- not only explicitly, but also between the lines -- a great enthusiasm for literature.