Reclaiming the System: Moral Responsibility, Divided Labour, and the Role of Organizations in Society

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Lisa Herzog, Reclaiming the System: Moral Responsibility, Divided Labour, and the Role of Organizations in Society, Oxford University Press, 2018, 336pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198830405.

Reviewed by Eugene Heath, State University of New York at New Paltz


The moral challenges of organizations have received little attention from philosophers and political theorists -- until now. In this book, Lisa Herzog examines how modern organizations -- profit and non-profit, public and private -- have become the "source," and not just the "site," of ethical problems, including the loss of moral agency. Informed by recent work in political science, ethics, sociology, and management, she also draws from the thought of Max Weber, Émile Durkheim, and Hannah Arendt to consider ways in which moral agency and responsibility can nonetheless prevail in organizations whose rules and hierarchical structures pose particular moral challenges. Details from interviews with 32 individuals working in large and varied organizations enrich her inquiry. This well-motivated, serious, and interesting study probes a difficult, even elusive, topic. Its analyses and recommendations should be of interest to management theorists, political philosophers, and business ethicists, among others. One does not have to agree with Herzog's conclusions to recognize that she addresses, often in insightful and enlightening ways, a series of vital questions.

The book is divided into ten chapters, arranged into three distinct parts. The introductory chapter sets the context for the book and explains why the character of organizations cannot be reduced to an economic description in which individuals are "controlled exclusively by financial incentives" (16). In Part I (chapters 2 - 4), Herzog takes up the nature of organizations and their challenges to moral agency. In Chapter 2, she defends moral agency but also describes how it requires a supportive social context or "scaffolding" (43). Her description points to a question that should be asked more often: How should our institutions and organizations be structured so that moral action is rendered more rather than less likely? In chapter 3, she sets forth three "basic moral norms" that hold across society. The first is to "respect . . . all individuals"; the second, "to avoid individually caused harm to others"; and the third, "to avoid contributing to collectively caused harm to others" (51). Any organization should uphold these norms in its culture, structure, and practices. In chapter 4, Herzog draws from Weber's work to characterize an organization as a hierarchy of divided labor structured by rules. By virtue of its form, an organization is "inherently morally risky" -- it exposes employees to hierarchies and separates their actions from distant, sometimes unknown, consequences.

Before proceeding to Part II, in which Herzog delineates specific aspects of these risks, it is worth revisiting the "basic moral norms." Herzog does not explain why these are "basic," whether there could be other basic norms, or whether these norms have some order among themselves. Perhaps the first norm (that of respect) is, as Herzog affirms, "straightforward" (51), especially given how she elaborates it in terms of the denial of natural hierarchies or how she portrays it as compatible with the notion of "free and equal citizens" (52). But, she says, such equality of respect "translates" (52) into the idea that genuine ethical discussion must occur from a position or perspective of equality. Such a translation reveals how easily the abstract appeal to respect turns into a principle that could limit the kinds of arguments that one may make in the public realm. In the case of the second norm (avoid harm), described as "similarly uncontroversial," Herzog claims interest only in a "common-sense notion" that will include "physical or psychological harm" (53). She adds that psychological harm includes "a psychologically toxic atmosphere" (53). One might object, however, that atmospheric conditions are not always easy to gauge. In the case of the third norm (avoid collectively caused harm), its conditions of application seem even less determinate. Herzog admits that this norm does not specify "what" or "how much" individuals should do, but she adds, "one can defend the claim that they should 'do their bit', even if one acknowledges that it may not be easy to determine" (54). This explanation seems less than satisfactory. Herzog would strengthen her overall case if a more careful argument were supplied to explain these norms and to demonstrate how one makes the journey from the apparently "straightforward" claims to more robust conclusions, including those in later chapters.

In the four chapters of Part II, Herzog focuses on dimensions of organizations that raise the risk of moral violations. In chapter 5 she examines the advantages and disadvantages of the rules that coordinate the divided labor of organizations. One significant disadvantage occurs when the strict application of a rule yields an injustice or otherwise defeats the value underlying the rule. In such instances, she recommends the utilization of procedures, deemed "safety vaults" (100), by which a rule could be challenged if its application would yield a morally wrong decision. Herzog's proposal may have plausibility, but it requires procedures for determining who, among employees, will hear such cases and by what criteria they may deliberate them.

In Chapter 6 Herzog points out how the individuals within an organization "only come to know a tiny fraction of the chains of production they are involved in" (112), perhaps only the consequences of their "most immediate activity" (113). This lack of knowledge, Herzog attests, leads to a lack of meaning and an inability to control the normative status of one's actions. Persons could become "complicit in actions they would not endorse if they were fully aware of them" (114). Herzog's conclusion about complicity seems sound, but on the question of meaningful work matters seem more complicated. One does not have to know the exact ends to which one's labor contributes to find meaning in one's work, though it would surely be essential to know that one's work did not contribute to evil aims. Herzog also explores how persons within an organization may overlook moral information, especially if it reveals violations of basic moral norms. In addition, the hierarchical nature of organizations may lead to "epistemic injustices" (127) in which persons at lower levels in the hierarchy are denied respect as bearers of knowledge in a way that also denies them the respect owed to persons. Although Herzog admits that unequal epistemic treatment may be justified, one might wish for greater exploration of this crucial matter. More generally, Herzog advocates an "epistemic culture" that will encourage and support the sharing and receiving of knowledge, thereby building trust, which is "notoriously difficult to establish in social relations that are hierarchical" (135). Perhaps so, but trust can emerge in hierarchical groups, such as military and surgical teams, or between children and parents.

In Chapter 7, Herzog turns the spotlight on an organization's culture, specifically, how its ethos and expectations should not allow for the violation of basic moral norms, nor prevent or discourage individuals from evaluating an organizational endeavor in moral terms. She also suggests that the best way to control against unintended shifts in an organization's culture is to maintain "a strict orientation towards moral rules" (164). Although Herzog mentions that sometimes exceptions may be called for, she makes no reference to the "safety vaults" set forth in chapter 5. Instead, she suggests that the best way to deal with a rule whose application is unwise is "to work one's way 'around' such a norm instead of openly violating it" (164-5). What this "work . . . around" might mean, both practically and morally, remains unclear.

In Chapter 8, Herzog probes the question of identity -- how to establish a middle ground between complete identification with an organization and radical separation from it. Here she appeals to two models of reflection. She describes a "voice of conscience" which, following Arendt, emerges in contemplative solitude, as one is "stripped of all of her roles, as it were, listening and responding to her inner voice" (183). This voice will inform one of what not to do. Another mode of reflection, which indicates a positive action, occurs as we "see things from different perspectives" (184), whether these be the perspectives of one's distinct roles or the viewpoints of other persons. To put moral reflection into practice one must become a "transformational agent" who, by exercising "voice" rather than "exit," ensures that organizations do not violate basic moral norms. Employees should not be so "pressed" that "they have hardly any time for moral reflection" (205). Even if the encouragement of such reflection may appear as "a call for a re-politicization," says Herzog, "what is at stake is compliance with basic moral norms" (207). However, by the end of the book she states that "One of the most dangerous ideas currently widely held is that . . . we are not allowed to raise moral or political concerns at our workplaces" (255).

In Part III, Herzog addresses practical questions about how to alter the structures of both organizations and society in order to "reclaim the system" (218) and ensure compliance with basic moral norms. In chapter 9, she takes a "non-ideal" approach to organizations contending that respect for individuals as moral equals demands an end to "employment at will," the enactment of procedural safeguards on the firing of employees, and the institution of social insurance for any employee who departs an organization for moral reasons. She advocates for strong regulation to "create a level playing field among competitors" (233) so that no organization may gain an advantage by violating basic moral norms.

In the tenth and concluding chapter, Herzog offers a more aspirational approach. She challenges the shareholder conception of the firm as encouraging "ruthless, short-term profit maximization and the externalization of costs and risks to society" (243). Ownership of goods, she asserts, does not justify "authority over employees" (242). In fact, no managerial authority over employees is justified unless the corporation is "promot[ing] the public good" (242). She leaves open the legal form of a reformed corporation, but it is clear to her that the "privileges and rights of shareholders, managers, and other stakeholders could be carved out differently" than they are at present (243). Work must be rendered meaningful with the possibility of job rotation built into all positions and with all employees given the opportunity to assess the moral quality of organizational practices. She concludes with a call for workplace democracy that will transform power relations within organizations, protect rights of workers, provide a space for learning about democratic politics, and encourage the discovery of "moral risks" (253). The justification for such workplace democracy rests, she maintains, in the "basic moral norms" adumbrated at the commencement of the volume.

Herzog moves deftly over a wide literature and the result is an engaging, intelligent, and provocative set of considerations on a neglected topic. This is a real achievement, and readers will be informed and challenged by her work. Her underlying concern is important: to encourage individual moral commitment and to open organizations to "moral conversations" (256). Nonetheless, one of the striking features of the book, especially as it moves to its closing recommendations, is its tendency to avoid conversations with those who defend alternative perspectives. Herzog's conclusions might be more convincing if they were delivered after some engagement with the ideas of thinkers who might disagree with her proposals or analyses. There is, for example, no acknowledgement of the analyses of public choice theorists regarding the problems of regulation (or rent seeking), and there are few reasoned engagements with advocates of markets, those who take a shareholder view of corporations, or those who might question the practicality or justifiability of workplace democracy.

Despite these reservations, Herzog may be right about the overall theme: Some features of organizations increase the risks of violations of basic moral norms. However, such risks might be reduced in any number of ways, so it follows that there might be alternative resolutions to those she proposes. Or there might be trade-offs between moral risks and economic reward. But the idea of trade-offs is hardly mentioned (in one footnote she does allude to "tension" between job protections and a "flexible labour market," 228, note 31). There are some occasions, however, when Herzog seems to suggest that her aim is not simply to reduce risks but to avoid any violation of such basic norms; after all, she writes, efficiency is valuable in reducing costs "but not at the price of violating basic moral norms" (207).

Finally, as noted above, Herzog seeks to introduce into organizations a culture of moral discussion and democratic decision-making. Although she expresses a concern that organizational cultures may acquire their own power (165-6), she affirms, nonetheless, that the exchange of reasons provides a chance "that the better argument, and not only the more visible signal sent by the more powerful player, wins" (167). Perhaps so, though it is not clear to me that the "exchange of reasons" in democratic discussion generally mimics a civil, collegial, or deliberative discourse. Such "exchange" may manifest its own power relations, as when some voices are dispatched as ideological or as passé. Even if various voices are heard and the better argument wins, this result may still appear to the losing side less as the triumph of reason than as defeat, if not humiliation. These individuals, as well as many others, might prefer a hierarchical workplace whose ethos is embedded in everyday morals and where employment, like ownership, is governed by contract. For those who serve within these organizations it cannot be discounted that, at the end of the day, they go home from work with their pride and agency intact.