Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Critical Social Theory

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Bert van den Brink and David Owen (eds.), Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Critical Social Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 399pp., $91.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521864459.

Reviewed by Kevin Olson, University of California, Irvine


In its best moments, academic dialogue brings together the right people at the right time to push a fertile research program to new levels.  In this volume we have a carefully focused snapshot of such a moment.  The research program in question is Axel Honneth's sustained, increasingly influential attempt to develop a social theory of recognition.  The right people are a diverse group of philosophers and social scientists who have contributed to the broader understanding of recognition and its socio-political functions.  Here, editors Bert van den Brink and David Owen bring the right people together in a carefully assembled volume focusing on a crucial and underdeveloped aspect of Honneth's theory:  its relation to power.  This book is made up of carefully worked out papers, but retains the energy of their original conference presentation at Utrecht University.  It further captures the dialogical character of this event by including two detailed responses from Axel Honneth.

The issue under consideration lies at the heart of Honneth's conception of recognition:  the problem of power relations within the very practices of recognition.  Honneth's theory is particularly vulnerable to such problems.  It is realistic and comprehensive enough to consider recognition in many domains in which power is endemic, from intimate relations and domestic spheres to the institutional realms of law, politics, and the market economy.  When we think of these domains as making vital contributions to the full development of individual subjects, we must ask whether power can at the same time exercise a hidden influence.  In such circumstances, even normatively positive practices of recognition might produce effects that a critique of power -- a focus of Honneth's earlier work -- would find objectionable.  This poses a further challenge for the theory:  how can it separate out power-laden forms of recognition from those that are not distorted by power?  Absent some such normative means, we may have to conclude that there is a problematic complicity between recognition and power.  In this case both would be technologies for producing selves, equally dangerous in their capacity to create docile and useful subjects.

In a book spanning almost 400 pages, there is much to savor and much to discuss.  I can only sample the variety and quality of these approaches; some highly worthy essays won't be discussed in what follows.  This, however, only gives readers an added incentive to examine this complex and important volume themselves.


To pose the problem of recognition's complicity with power, van den Brink and Owen cluster essays around philosophical, social, and political themes.  The first cluster concentrates on philosophical issues central to the notion of recognition itself.  Heikki Ikäheimo and Arto Laitinen, Robert Pippin, Bert van den Brink, and Patchen Markell take a variety of directions that are innovative both in approach and in the skill with which they draw out key themes for consideration.  Ikäheimo and Laitinen, for instance, provide a bracing investigation of the meaning of recognition.  They bring tools of analytical philosophy to bear on a literature that has largely developed in a European, neo-Hegelian idiom, showing how both approaches gain strength when they are combined.  Recognition, in their careful analysis, is a dialogical process that requires the autonomy of both recognizer and recognizee.  Moreover, this process makes a minimal but meaningful reference to objective states of affairs, referring to a world outside of the immediate, interpersonal context of recognition relations themselves.  This objective element, Ikäheimo and Laitinen claim, could provide a basis for identifying power-distorted and ideological forms of recognition.

Bert van den Brink's essay drives home the importance of developing resources for dealing with ideology.  He brings such issues squarely to the fore by situating Honneth's work in relation to Theodor Adorno's.  The question, from this perspective, is whether Honneth's attempt to articulate a comprehensive conception of ethical life doesn't risk reification and false positivity.  Van den Brink contrasts Honneth's view with the fragility and contingency of recognition in Adorno's work.  He uses this contrast to raise an important question:  whether a comprehensive, institutionalized conception of ethical life might not foreclose opportunities for people to challenge it.  In this case, a hegemonic form of ethical life and its accompanying forms of recognition would reproduce the status quo to the disadvantage of those with an interest in changing it.  What's worse, this depoliticization of ethical life would occur under the banner of shared ideals.  Viewed with these worries in the background, Adorno's much more tentative, fragile, and unruly view of recognition maintains a robust pessimism that, in van den Brink's estimation, leaves room to challenge power and ideology in social relations.

Patchen Markell's contribution is equally probing.  He addresses Honneth's debt to George Herbert Mead, drawing out tensions in Mead's work to suggest similar problems for Honneth.  At stake is the extent to which individual subjectivity is socially conditioned versus novel in a more purely individualistic, non-social sense.  The mistake, Markell asserts, would be to dichotomize our view of the self in a way that associates novelty, spontaneity, and potentiality with the individual self while connecting constraint and actuality with the social self.  This would distort our idea of the injustices that result from misrecognition:  we would see them as (social) failures to realize (individual) potentials.  The cost would be a blindness to important forms of injustice -- ones rooted in actuality regardless of the relation to some untapped potential -- while also relegating dominated people to the status of potential and thus disempowered agents.  Resolving such problems, Markell insightfully argues, requires a focus on the conditions of one's own actions like that found in his own view of "failures of acknowledgement."


Beate Rössler, Lior Barshack, and Iris Young raise issues of a different sort.  Gender relations and the domestic sphere are crisscrossed by power while also serving as important sites of recognition.  The thinkers in this section broadly agree that Honneth has not developed an adequate understanding of the kinds of recognition operative in love relations, and that care work should not be equated with market labor as a basis for esteem.

Rössler focuses on the latter theme, drawing out the historically changing ways in which labor is valued.  She uses this tableau to show the negative consequences of Honneth's proposal to value care work in the same ways as waged labor.  Commodifying care-giving labor would deny the special character of the family by evaluating it according to the standards of the marketplace.  Yet here Rössler finds Honneth's critique of recognition in the sphere of paid labor equally lacking.  It has problems seeing beyond recognition conveyed by monetary reward itself.  These two lines of critique converge in a broader assessment of the limitations of recognition as a critique of labor.  Rössler persuasively argues that a richer normative vocabulary -- one going beyond recognition -- is needed for theorizing both commodified and non-commodified forms of labor.

Iris Young follows a similar path, challenging the separation between love and "public" forms of recognition.  Using Rousseau's outrageously asymmetrical view of love relations as a backdrop, Young argues that Honneth doesn't go far enough in establishing a more reciprocal, egalitarian view.  At the same time, she claims that caring labor has an awkward place in Honneth's theory.  Architectonically it should be theorized as a form of esteem, but Young points out that so far such forms of recognition have to be analogized to the market economy in Honneth's view.  Care would thus have to be esteemed as a productive activity or competitive achievement.  In sum, Honneth hasn't yet developed his views on love as fully as those on respect and esteem; and in Young's view, a better understanding of love would provide a more adequate view of the senses in which care work ought to be esteemed.

This section provides a valuable spur to expanding the positive understanding of the ways that domestic activities are esteemed (or not), and the ways that love relations between mature people provide important forms of recognition that we do not completely understand.  A valuable supplement to these pieces would combine the understanding that they call for with a critique of exploitation and domination within such forms of recognition themselves, since they occur in a sphere that is often constructed as intimate, private, domestic, and thus immune to such problems.


In section three, Rainer Forst, Veit Bader, Anthony Simon Laden, and David Owen raise issues dealing with the "official" political sphere as opposed to the politics of home and family.  Forst tackles such issues directly in his probing analysis of the connections between recognition and toleration.  He finds common ground between these two ideas in the notion of respect.  It furnishes the basis for a democratic, egalitarian form of toleration that avoids the power relations implicit in other forms.  At the same time, this idea describes a form of recognition already well known to Honneth's readers.  For Forst, the form of respect common to both of these domains is one giving people a basic right to the justification of shared norms and social arrangements.  He insightfully connects political and legal forms of recognition with the bases of toleration by taking them both through a linguistic turn.

Power also comes directly to the fore in Veit Bader's contribution.  He challenges the monism of a theory of justice oriented towards just one category of claim -- in this case, recognition.  Bader notes that such a theory would take on a much smaller burden of proof if it were centered around claims of misrecognition, because negative claims of insult are easier to establish than positive ones that hinge on a full-blown theory of self-development.  Yet this is also too narrow:  even social notions of misrecognition are constructed within predominant power relations, so they risk reproducing those relations rather than challenging them.  A broader approach to problems of power and incapacitation is needed then, one including but not limited to a critique of misrecognition.

David Owen examines the connection between Honneth's formal conception of ethical life and his account of democracy as reflexive cooperation.  According to Owen, this connection confers advantages on Honneth's politics not enjoyed by either republican or procedural competitors.  The close relation of politics and ethical life also creates problems, however.  Owen argues that such a conception of democracy must theorize political community as composed not only of individuals but also of ethically plural groups, some of which may have significantly different criteria for esteeming a person.  Such pluralism risks subordinating subaltern groups, however:  the authority of a person's political voice is determined by hegemonic conceptions of discursive capabilities and personal commitments, privileging the voices of some sub-communities over others.  In Owen's thoughtful and provocative view, the reflexive conception has unique abilities to respond to such problems, though this would result in a more multi-perspectival, group-conscious, and rhetoric-critical notion of democracy.


Axel Honneth meets the issues of power raised here in an essay of his own.  His particular focus is on ideology as a form of power working through nominally acceptable modalities of recognition, an issue raised earlier in Bert van den Brink's essay.  Honneth ponders what an ideological form of recognition would look like.  He reasons that it would be similar in certain ways to normalization or a Foucauldian conception of productive power:  it would be situated in a largely taken-for-granted social and historical context, causing people voluntarily to modify their own behavior for reasons that seem rational to them.  Ideology is also different from this, though, because it is lodged in a gap between belief and reality:  ideological beliefs are false in some objective sense.  The problem, of course, is to distinguish normatively objectionable, ideological forms of recognition from those arising through normal social interaction.  Honneth wisely declines to rely on a trans-historical normative standpoint, locating a criterion instead in the material grounds of recognition itself.  Recognition becomes ideological, he reasons, when people adapt their beliefs and behaviors to circumstances that cannot materially support them.  The neo-liberal labor market is his example:  people are encouraged to become self-actualizing risk-takers and entrepreneurs in market conditions that prey on such vulnerabilities rather than support the people undertaking them.  Here Honneth successfully tackles an important site of ideological recognition while avoiding the difficulties of earlier Marxist objectivist theories.  He does this by devising an incisive form of materialism that can reveal exploitation masquerading as social approbation.

While Honneth succeeds in characterizing an ideological form of recognition, one is even more struck by some of his insights along the way.  The similarities he traces between recognition and productive power deserve to be pursued in greater detail.  His acknowledgement of the difficulties of standing "outside" of a given society's recognition practices is salutary:  what counts as worth recognizing is socially and historically situated; one hopes for some normative grounds of critique yet suspects that there is no firm ground on which to stand.  While tracing this argument, Honneth puts his finger on a set of issues one would like to hear more about.  In a volume examining the relation between recognition and power, Michel Foucault's landmark contribution receives relatively little play.  This is troubling because Foucault's conception of capillary, omnipresent power poses a significant challenge to views like Honneth's.  It is a sign of intellectual honesty that Honneth himself raises Foucauldian concerns most prominently in this volume -- though not a surprise, given his own insightful engagements with Foucault in earlier work.  While Honneth ably raises these issues and shows the value of ideology as a diagnostic category, problems of normalization and productive power continue to haunt.

Axel Honneth brings the volume to a close by responding in detail to each of his interlocutors.  Here he elaborates on his own views while adding new wrinkles of complexity to the discussion already underway.  This review can't do justice to the back-and-forth of arguments and counter-arguments found there.  Honneth's response is the reward for arriving at the end of an already stimulating volume.  By engaging his critics and moving the discussion of recognition and power forward another significant step, Honneth ensures that this is not in fact the end of the discussion, but only a new beginning.