Recognition and Social Ontology

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Heikki Ikäheimo and Arto Laitinen (eds.), Recognition and Social Ontology, Brill, 2011, 398pp., $182.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004202900.

Reviewed by William Rehg, Saint Louis University


In assembling the contributions to Recognition and Social Ontology, the editors aim to bring together "two contemporary, intensively debated fields of inquiry: Hegel-inspired theories of recognition (Anerkennung) and analytic social ontology" (1). Considering the difficulty of this goal, the collection does rather well overall. Robert Brandom, whose own work deeply embodies the analytic engagement with Hegel, provides the lead contribution. Brandom's chapter in turn provokes critical reactions in several subsequent chapters. A number of chapters attempt to show how Hegel can inform analytic social philosophy. And chapters that do not explicitly focus on Hegel nonetheless contribute to the analysis of mutual recognition.

The editors assign the essays to three parts, the first two of which are dominated by the figure of Hegel. Appropriately so, given that the most famous discussion of social recognition occurs in Hegel's account of the life-and-death struggle for mutual recognition. Hegel's treatment sits at a crucial point in his Phenomenology of Spirit, where he makes the transition from contemplative to practical engagement with the world. Opening the first section, on the ontology of personhood, Brandom and Robert Pippin each offer penetrating reflections on that particularly obscure transition in Hegel. It helps to begin with Pippin, who situates Hegel's text in its broader context. As Pippin explains, Hegel's abrupt move from perception to life is not arbitrary, but rather represents an attempt to go beyond Kant's formal "I think" to engaged consciousness. For Hegel, consciousness is not mere self-certainty or self-observation; it is, first of all, the practical relation-to-self of a living creature for whom things are potential means or threats to survival. Consequently, at this basic level consciousness is desire, a taking of things as objects for an interested subject. But these takings are fallible, open to correction. For a creature that acts not merely on immediate desires but on its conception of its desires, that is, on reasons, in a context of other such creatures, desires face the possibility of challenge -- and hence are subject to the normativity of others' recognition.

At issue for Brandom and Pippin is this move from desire through recognition to self-consciousness. As both commentators note, a creature is essentially self-conscious insofar as what it really is "in itself" is partly constituted by what it is "for itself," that is, its self-conception, some features of which are essential to its sense of self. For Hegel, essential features are those for which one would risk one's very life -- hence his famous image of the struggle unto death. Brandom regards that image as metonymy, a dramatic example of the more general point that one's self-conception hangs on personal commitments for which one is willing to take risks and make sacrifices. Self-transformation through experience -- that is, learning -- unfolds as a process of identifying and choosing between incompatible commitments. Because practical commitments have conceptual content, Brandom's reading brings Hegel into the former's inferentialist semantics, according to which conceptual contents are cashed out in terms of normative networks of inferential commitments that are modified in the course of social interaction.

For Brandom, then, the trick is to explain how recognition mediates the transition from desire to normative commitments. If desiring means taking a thing as something of significance for oneself, then we can understand recognition as a species of desire, namely my taking you to have (for me) the practical significance of being a subject capable of attributing practical significance to things. For human beings, Brandom argues, that kind of "taking" has normative implications for one's own desiring: I can take you as taking an object as having "X"-significance only if I acknowledge your authority to do so also for my own takings. Brandom's subsequent analysis -- too complex to trace out here -- relies on a formal-logical argument that if such recognition is transitive (such that if A recognizes B, then B recognizes A), then reciprocal recognition must involve self-recognition, and thus self-consciousness.

Pippin objects that Brandom's inferentialist framework does not do justice to Hegel's text. Brandom's "divergences" lead him to miss the significance that the struggle unto death had for Hegel, as a struggle between "opposed self-consciousnesses" (74). On Hegel's premises, the transition from desire to self-consciousness via recognition "has to be a profound contention that can, initially or minimally conceived, only be resolved by the death of one, or the complete subjection of one to the other" (75).

Pirmin Stekeler-Weithofer also criticizes Brandom, charging him with the cognitive naturalism that dominates contemporary cognitive science. According to Stekeler-Weithofer, Hegel went beyond Kant in developing a logic that included "generics" (Hegel's category of Allgemeinheit), such as "cows eat grass" and "human beings are language-users." Generics are neither a priori analytic statements nor universally quantified empirical statements, but rather express a community's joint knowledge about various concepts. Because Brandom's "scorekeepers" lack joint normative commitments to generics, their recognition of linguistic moves is merely factual, lacking any normative basis for distinguishing between their taking a linguistic move as valid and its really being valid. Thus Brandom's view collapses into behaviorism, more specifically a "social regularism" (95). Stekeler-Weithofer goes on to show how joint commitments operate even at the level of perception. Kantian "Intuition" (Anschauung) presupposes the uniquely human capacity for joint conduct, more specifically a learning process in which child and adult exercise a joint attention subject to mutual control, each party checking the propriety of the other's reactions to the object of attention. Thus perception itself is a social practice that presupposes mutual recognition.

The second part of the book widens the scope of discussion. Three of the four chapters examine the relevance of Hegel for contemporary thought. Ludwig Siep opens with a helpful critical overview of recent attempts by Brandom, Pippin, Pinkard, Honneth, Taylor, and Ricoeur to put Hegel's conception of mutual recognition to work on contemporary concerns. Siep has doubts about this trend. The idea of recognition, he argues, lacks the resources to deal with three problems in social philosophy: distributive justice, cultural pluralism, and the relationship between humanity and nature.

Heikki Ikäheimo argues that Hegel can make a positive contribution to contemporary Anglophone social philosophy. Because the social ontologists in that tradition (e.g., Tuomela, Gilbert) begin with fully formed persons, they lack the means to analyze fundamental social phenomena that are constitutive of persons. Hegel's account of mutual recognition fills that gap: a systematic analysis of the internal relationships between the constitution of persons and the constitution of the social world. Ikäheimo devotes most of his chapter to addressing some obstacles to a positive Hegel reception, in particular the obstacle posed by Hegel's Aristotelian "normative essentialism," which holds that (a) some features of "the human life-form are essential to it"; (b) these features can be realized to different degrees; (c) the more they are realized, the better; and (d) such essential features have an immanent tendency to realize themselves (159). Ikäheimo shows how normative essentialism matches our commonsense. Thus, going beyond Brandom and Pinkard, Ikäheimo argues that mutual recognition, understood as an essential ideal immanent in human life-forms, is realized to the degree that fear of the other becomes respect, and instrumentalization of the other becomes love.

Paul Redding likewise hopes to rehabilitate Hegel for contemporary philosophy, in particular by using the idea of mutual recognition to rescue Hegel from the "spiritualistic" metaphysics often attributed to him. However, rather than secularize Hegel's view of the Christian doctrines of the Trinity and Incarnation as immature expressions of Absolute Spirit, Redding argues that these religious images are necessary for resolving the "Kantian paradox" -- Kant's idea of the divided autonomous self as "subject only to those laws it gives itself" (231). Redding's conclusion appears no less paradoxical: as the locus of moral imperatives, "in some sense" God exists only in virtue of our recognition; nonetheless, we must not think of God merely as our own creation (232).

Turning to Karl Marx, Michael Quante delves into a striking early text on exchange relationships and recognition. Like Hegel, Marx takes an essentialist approach with ethical implications. But his analysis of market relations goes beyond Hegel's. Whereas Hegel saw market relations as an abstract form of mutual recognition, in which contracting parties recognize each other as free, Marx shows how market actors are mutually estranged from their essential "species-being." Although each party produces goods that meet the other's needs -- which reflect the human species-being -- each party is motivated, not by concern for the other's need, but only by a selfish desire for the other's product. Thus exchange involves a struggle for recognition in which each party strives to get the better of the deal, that is, to have the other recognize the greater worth of its product and consent to the exchange. According to Marx's "evaluative counter-proposal" (261ff), in a fully human exchange we would respond directly to each other's neediness, motivated by the consciousness of producing for each other's human realization. Though Marx's analysis seems impossibly utopian, it shows how a market mentality perverts our sense of human dignity: rather than recognize our shared humanity in our mutual neediness, we value self-reliant individuals and disdain the needy.

With the exception of the last chapter, Hegel plays no direct role in the third part of the book. Leading off the section, Margaret Gilbert draws on Charles Taylor's analysis of public space. Building on Taylor, Gilbert argues that mutual recognition can arise in very simple situations, for example, when two people sharing a table at a library acknowledge each other's presence with a nod. The two readers do not merely share common knowledge of each other's presence. By their brief mutual acknowledgement, they enter into a joint commitment to "recognize as a body" each other's presence (278). The readers thereby form a plural subject of intention. Gilbert concludes by briefly extending this analysis to the phenomenon of joint attention.

Italo Testa focuses on "recognitive powers" as constitutive of the recognized objects and properties. Should we take such talk literally -- does recognition bring the object into being ex nihilo? Recalling Plato's Euthyphro, Testa poses a paradox: "Is something X because it is recognized as X, or is something recognized as X because it is X?" (302) His solution starts by distinguishing three dimensions of recognition: (1) a cognizing subject's perceptual reidentification of an object, (2) the subject's relation to self, which involves both reidentification and attestation, and (3) the reciprocal recognition between two or more subjects who reciprocally identify each other and attest their identities in relation to shared norms, where "norms" includes norms of respect, role obligations, and conceptual relations that govern self-descriptions and attributions of social status. Building on Searle, Testa argues that a strong anti-realist solution to the paradox is implausible along the first, perceptual dimension. Because the three dimensions are not independent, Testa concludes that reciprocal forms of recognition also must involve "reactions to properties given and perceived as real" (303). That said, an adequate realist solution must still make room for the effect of recognition on its object. Testa thus proposes an expressivist solution: as an "expressive labor of determination" of objects (including persons), recognition "is always the expression of something that is given but in an indeterminate form and whose determination is not independent of the labor of determination" (304).

Arto Laitinen takes the analysis of recognition still further, distinguishing four "aspects of taking someone as a person": the belief that X is a person; the moral opinion that choices regarding the treatment of X are morally significant; the willingness to treat X accordingly; and the "unselfish Recognitive Attitudes," such as respect and concern, that explain such willingness (313). He then goes on to qualify the "Ambitious View" associated with some Hegelians who stress the co-constitutive relationship between mutual recognition and socioinstitutional reality. Laitinen argues that mutual recognition, though normally a necessary condition for group agency and institutional cooperation, is not sufficient. He closes by further delineating other forms of recognition (of reasons, principles, and institutions) and their relationship to interpersonal recognition.

Titus Stahl picks up the theme of institutional power, understood as a kind of authority. Drawing on Searle, Stahl starts with the idea that a person's institutional power is a capacity "created through a system of status functions which entitles the person to issue demands upon the actions of others" (351; emphasis removed). That capacity is constituted by members' acceptance, that is, their willingness, in the relevant circumstances, to accept the authority's evaluations of their behavior and sanctions for noncompliance with institutional norms. Following Gilbert and Tuomela, Stahl argues for the collective character of such acceptance, which he links with a kind of mutual recognition, distinct from Hegel's idea. More precisely, Stahl's "recognition account" of institutional power holds that the collective acceptance of institutional power depends not only on the recognition of the authority's status but, at a deeper level, on acceptance of the system of rules in which the authority operates. The latter counts as collective acceptance, however, only if members collectively accept both rules and their interpretation and application. Stahl concludes that "Institutional authority is constituted through the collective acceptance of power, and this collective acceptance of power is, in turn, constituted through the mutual recursive acceptance of normative authority between the participants in an institution" (364). Stahl closes with some implications of this analysis for sociological methodology and social critique.

The last essay, by Vincent Descombes, returns to Hegel. Descombes wants to understand the paradoxical question in Hegel's Philosophy of Right, "Who is to frame the constitution?" For Hegel, the question does not make sense: either the would-be framers are an atomistic collection of individuals, who thus lack the moral unity that a political constitution presupposes, or they already identify themselves as a people, a Volk, in which case they already exist as a constituted "moral unity," whose unwritten constitution exists in its Volksgeist. Descombes insists that this term does not refer to a superagent, but simply to the shared laws, manners, and customs by which the people identify themselves as a group. To further clarify the idea, Descombes opposes Montesquieu to Searle. The former distinguishes laws, as the act of a political legislator, from the social manners and customs that arise impersonally, in the sense that they do not originate in any personal intention. Searle's theory of institutions suggests a middle ground: a way to think of manners and customs as a result of collective intentionality, without invoking political metaphors of legislation. But Searle's model, Descombes argues, fails to account for the origin of institutions. Hegel's paradox returns: a group cannot take itself to have instituting powers unless it is already "instituted as a 'we'" (388). Thus Hegel has the last word: objective spirit retains priority over subjective spirit.