Recognition and the Human Life-Form: Beyond Identity and Difference

Recognition And The Human Life Form

Heikki Ikäheimo, Recognition and the Human Life-Form: Beyond Identity and Difference, Routledge, 2022, 249pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 978032139999.

Reviewed by J.M. Bernstein, New School for Social Research


A fair summation of Heikki Ikäheimo’s compelling, wide-ranging, and analytically acute study would be to say that it is a massive commentary on Hegel’s brief, four page fragment on “Love” (1797 or 1798)—despite the fact that Ikäheimo nowhere references this text of Hegel’s. In that fragment, Hegel employs the model of romantic love in order to launch a wide-ranging critique of the philosophical anthropology, social ontology, and ethics of Kantian moral individualism. While one element of the critique is Hegel’s contention that we are essentially living beings inhabiting an organically vital living world rather than pure rational minds inhabiting a world of (Newtonian) dead matter, the deeper critique turns on the thesis that in love, the lovers are no longer wholly separate selves, autonomous subjects, epistemically and morally self-sufficient beings. Rather, the lives of lovers become so joined that they become part of “a living whole” in which “one exists only for the other, and hence exists in and for itself only on the strength of a power outside itself” (Hegel 1975, 305). Patently, Hegel intends the idea of existing only on the basis of a power outside oneself to take the argument from describing the character of romantic feelings to a relational social ontology in which one’s self-relation is mediated through one’s recognition relations with others. As his claim that neither the “understanding” nor “reason” are adequate to the social ontology of love makes evident, Hegel also intends to argue that perhaps only a loving attitude might be adequate for experiencing love and hence for bringing the phenomenon of love into view. In his later writings, following Fichte’s lead, Hegel fleshes out the argument for an intersubjectively constituted social ontology implied in the love fragment in terms of a logic of recognition, a logic first broached in the famous passage on lordship and bondage in the Phenomenology of Spirit. Hegel’s turn to recognition does not repudiate the love thesis but expands it: love is a way of describing the world; love of another is love of the world. The compulsive trajectory of Hegel’s fragment is the claim that love opens one to a completely different relation to objectivity; the account of recognition in his later writings explains how that re-constitution of the structure of experience and objectivity is possible.

The orienting gestures of Ikäheimo’s study are perfect analogues of Hegel’s procedure: Ikäheimo argues that “beyond identity and difference,” recognition is not to be understood as solely concerned with identity politics (Charles Taylor and Nancy Fraser in Chapter 4); nor can it be exhausted by the complex combined transcendental ethics and political morality of Axel Honneth, in which familial love, legal respect, and workplace social esteem become necessary conditions for complete moral recognition of an individual as a person (Chapter 5); rather, following the lead of Fichte’s Foundations of Natural Right (Chapter 2) and the chapter on “Self-consciousness” in the “Subjective Spirit” part of Hegel’s Encyclopedia of Philosophical Sciences (Chapter 3), recognition must be comprehended as constitutive of the social ontology of the human life-form in which the attitude of love exemplifies purely intersubjective recognition, thereby providing the normative foundation and causal condition for full-fledged personhood (Chapter 6).

Ikäheimo’s argumentative strategy is to begin (in Chapter 1) by making an elaborate series of conceptual distinctions: the recognition of persons is the phenomenon to be understood; such recognition can be either vertical or horizontal; vertical recognition can be either downwards from the state toward its citizens, bestowing rights, or upwards from citizens to the authority of the state; horizontal recognition can be either norm-mediated or purely intersubjective; norm-mediated recognition can be institutional, as in citizens recognizing one another as having equal rights and equal authority, or simply social through everyday practices in which mutual recognition is normatively presupposed; purely intersubjective recognition can be either deontological (through conditional attributions of authority or an unconditional attitude of respect), axiological (through a conditional concern for the well-being of others or unconditional love), or contributive (through instrumental valuing or unconditional gratitude). As presented, both here but in the book too (with a branching tree diagram provided on page 26), these distinctions can feel merely analytical. The point of Ikäheimo’s analytic reconstruction of the theories of recognition provided by the five authors he discusses is to motivate the necessity of these conceptual distinctions, to demonstrate that for each, something of either ontological or moral significance is at stake; and then in the final chapter of his book, “Recognition, the Human Life-Form, and Full-Fledged Personhood,” to simultaneously demonstrate that purely intersubjective recognition, that is, love, is constitutive of human personhood, securing the social ontological thesis, and that it is foundational for the related norm-mediated forms of recognition necessary for full-fledged personhood, thus securing the moral claim. Because the readings of the five philosophers are for the sake of his final theory, and on the whole, is both lucid and fair, I want to focus on Ikäheimo’s own proposed philosophy of recognition.

A governing theme of Ikäheimo’s argument is the primacy of the “intersubjective mediation of subjectivity that takes place through (purely intersubjective) recognition [that] is constitutive of person-making psychological structures” (54) over the norm-mediated forms of recognition provided by social norms and institutional roles, rules, and rights. Defending this primacy is meant to underlie and support the claim that “recognition in the purely intersubjective sense is in many ways both the ontological and the ethical backbone of the human life-form” (18). One reason for this primacy is that purely intersubjective recognition has a depth that institution-mediated recognition lacks. In the latter case, what matters are the actions or omissions of persons toward one another; you may treat me with respect, as socially required, but deep down despise me and people who look like me. Conversely, purely intersubjective recognition operates through attitudes that mediate “the intentionalities or subjective perspectives of the subjects via each other so that the recognizer’s perspective adopts or appropriates something of the recognizee’s perspective in itself and thus makes the recognizer see the world from the perspective of the recognizee” (84). That is, we must distinguish between deontological rules that optimally ensure equal treatment, which is one type of mediation of my standing and selfhood through others, from the attitudinal-psychological constitution of subjectivity in which one’s most minimal self-relation is already instituted through how the other attitudinally sees one: one is aware of oneself through the other. Hence, one’s own perspective on the world is a priori decentered; it already includes the perspective of the other—even when that fact is repressed, socially or individually. This version of the primacy of love thesis depends on recognition relations belonging to the earliest stratum of infant socialization, what Fichte had already proposed in his claim concerning the summons (36–49, 53–6).

Ikäheimo’s second ground for privileging purely intersubjective recognition against its norm-mediated forms—including what he terms “deontological neo-Hegelianism” where recognitions occur through rules and norms “all the way down”—turns on distinguishing the reach of deontology from what he calls the axiological dimension of recognition. If another possesses the standing of a person in our community, I might respect her, but it is not required that I be concerned with or care about her life or well-being. To recognize another as simultaneously other and yet dependent on me as I am on her is to begin to view the world from her perspective, which minimally requires not merely formally refraining from actions that cannot be universalized, say, but also substantively taking into account her conception of her well-being. Indeed, one cannot apply rules intended to treat others as ends in themselves in particular cases without sensitivity to how the other conceives of her needs and well-being: the application of deontological norms requires judgment that is axiologically context sensitive (88). Although he does not say so, in contrasting deontological and axiological dimensions of recognition—his philosophical anthropological generalization of Honneth’s notions of respect and love—Ikäheimo is reworking the feminist, care ethics’ critique of Kantianism as functionally patriarchal.[1]

In his third argument for privileging the purely intersubjective love model of recognition, Ikäheimo means to demonstrate that the wide philosophical anthropology of recognition—i.e., being recognized as a person axiologically, deontologically, and contributively (the philosophical anthropological generalization of social esteem)—is foundational for the idea of full-fledged personhood, hence also for the idea that social ontology begets morality. In effect, to widen the Fichtean logic, the very nature of being a person is such that we are effectively always “summoning” others to recognize our claim to recognition, to recognize us as a person. This is the sense in which all intersubjective relations contain a lining or dimension of recognition claiming, of desiring recognition. Only under extreme inhumane conditions is that claim fully disqualified—which makes a condition inhumane as such. Ikäheimo’s premise is that in making a claim for recognition we must in effect be making a claim for unconditional rather than merely instrumental or conditional recognition, e.g., you should recognize my personhood full stop versus you should recognize my personhood if you want your pyramids built. I cannot have a merely conditional sense of my own self-worth, my own dignity; hence, in claiming recognition, which is the lining of all my social interactions, I am making an unconditional claim for recognition of my dignity. Hence, “the dignity of a psychological person consists in his or her unconditional self-recognition—self-love, self-respect, and conception of oneself as gratitude worthy—and that unconditional mode of purely intersubjective recognition in its three forms by others is what the dignity of a person presents a claim for” (225). For reasons I shall come to directly, this is unconvincing, and almost certainly false.

Before coming to that problem, though, I do want to underline that although I am suspicious of Ikäheimo’s argument that recognition belongs to philosophical anthropology and social ontology more critically and laterally than directly, the core of his thesis here is persuasive: unless our status or standing as a person were constituted through relations of recognition, such that our relation to self includes a norm-saturated status claim to worth, practices of dehumanization like slavery, torture, rape, and racism, for example, could not operate or devastate as they are almost universally acknowledged to do (218). The claim of recognition is that the other’s attitude towards me should involve my existential significance for her being the recognition of a being with the status of being person. Inhumanity involves not having that significance for the other. Further, following Michael Tomasello (2009) and Kim Sterelny (2012), Ikäheimo accepts that there are three fundamental “facts” of evolution for the human life-form, namely, the shift from acting from instinctual response to acting from linguistically-mediated social norms and rules; the structuring of individual and collective life as temporally oriented toward the future—daily; seasonally; generationally—rather than functional immersion in the present; and finally to the organizing of a social world as a cooperative venture. He then argues that each of these fundamental facts of the evolution of the human form of life are most plausibly actualized when seen in relation to the three dimensions of recognition: axiological well-being, the very idea of a good life; institutional (roles and rights) and social (norms) deontology; and relations of social cooperation premised on the recognition of others’ contribution (gratitude). While one might have wished to hear a good deal more on this topic, placing recognition so clearly into the context of evolution gives point to the Fichte-Hegel argument that recognition, in the first instance, belongs to philosophical anthropology and social ontology; and that its significance for ethics depends on its constitutive structuring of the human life-form.

Nonetheless, Ikäheimo’s contention, underlined on the very last page of the book (235), that the claim for recognition is unconditional across all three forms fails. Here are four considerations for thinking the structures of recognition are more historically contoured than Ikäheimo acknowledges. First, the very distinction between the unconditional and the instrumental/conditional becomes a dualism with overwhelming moral significance only in the modern world. Persons living in face-to-face or relevantly small, cohesive communities effectively recognized others as either belonging to their community or not; and while there might have been reasons for instrumentally cooperating with strangers, communal membership was the constitutive fact. Conversely, once community belonging collapses as the governing principle of social life, and market relations make all relevant others competitive strangers, and formal laws can be used to regulate social interactions, then a logic of instrumental relations among persons is universalized, making the issue of which relations are not wholly instrumental a lively moral, political, and existential question. Second, we know that even when unconditional recognition was historically announced—say, in the Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen—almost no one actually conceived of it as having universal application. Struggles for recognition created modern universality and unconditionality that would not have existed without those struggles. But this entails, third, that the very idea of dignity, the unconditionality of the claim for recognition from the first person point of view, is in its weighty, universalist sense probably no more than 70 years old, going back to 1948. But fourth, this view can be compelling if we acknowledge that even those pulsing inaugural moments of purely intersubjective recognition, first love, have been socially hierarchically organized: the announcement at birth of “It’s a boy” or “It’s a girl” brings down upon the neophyte a social fate. But this is as much to say that one’s self-recognition need not be a priori unconditional; historically, understandings of self-worth were contoured through variegated social hierarchies. Dignitarian self-conceptions and demands for unconditional recognition are a particular, and a particularly urgent contouring of the present brutally inegalitarian, instrumental social landscape.

In pressing the argument this way, I am siding with Judith Butler’s contention that “The struggle for recognition is bound up with the problem of dependency, including unmanageable dependency, and so also with the ambivalence that Freud, following Hegel, understands as a constitutive feature of all love relations.”[2] While Butler is here insisting upon love as the inaugural moment and fulcrum for a philosophical anthropology and social ontology constituted through relations of recognition, she is also reminding us how difficult love is, how the experience of interdependency can become unbearable and intolerable, and how our exposure to the other in this utterly intimate manner, my sense of self always and everywhere mediated by the other, is a social crucible for which there are indefinitely many responses. It is worth recalling that placing recognition at the center of one’s social ontology does not entail that one’s ethical theory or political morality have structures of recognition as the core: Hegel was primarily concerned with social freedom; Butler presses for a theory of non-violence; but equally one might think that human rights or radical social equality or equal dignity or political love (234) are the natural fulfillment of a recognitional social ontology.

In his unconditionality thesis, Ikäheimo has even more fervently than Hegel accepted a certain romantic version of the love model for social recognition. Which is a reason for, not against, reading this book. Because of the breadth and its always acute argumentation, Ikäheimo's book is not only essential reading for philosophers interested in the philosophy of recognition, but even more essential reading for those who believe that philosophical anthropology, social ontology, and moral theory can be done in the absence of a theory recognition.


Butler, Judith. 2021. “Recognition and the Social Bond: A Response to Axel Honneth,” in Recognition and Ambivalence, edited by Heikki Ikäheimo, Kristina Lepold, and Titus Stahl. Columbia University Press: 31–53.

Gilligan, Carol. 1993. In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women’s Development. Harvard University Press.

Hegel, G.W.F. 1975. “Love.” trans. T.M. Knox, in G.W.F. Hegel, Early Theological Writings. University of Pennsylvania Press: 302–308.

Ikäheimo, Heikki. 2021. “Return to Reification: An Attempt at Systematization,” in Recognition and Ambivalence, edited by Heikki Ikäheimo, Kristina Lepold, and Titus Stahl. Columbia University Press: 191–222.

Sterelny, Kim. 20212. The Evolved Apprentice: How Evolution Made Humans Unique. The MIT Press.

Tomasello, Michael. 2009. Why We Cooperate, The MIT Press.


[1] For the classic statement of this thesis see, Gilligan, 1993.

[2] Butler, 2021: 44–5. In the same volume, Ikäheimo provides another defense of his unconditionality thesis: 191–222