Recognizing Wrongs

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John C. P. Goldberg and Benjamin C. Zipursky, Recognizing Wrongs, Harvard University Press, 2020, 380pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674241701.

Reviewed by John Oberdiek, Rutgers University


Over the past twenty-plus years, through more than two dozen co-authored papers and others authored individually, John Goldberg and Benjamin Zipursky have established themselves as major figures in tort theory and private law theory more generally. They are the two most-cited tort law scholars in the United States and for good reason. Goldberg and Zipursky have combined a commanding knowledge of legal doctrine with philosophical sophistication to develop a novel and attractive account of tort law, one which places wrongs and recourse at its center. Their theory finds its most comprehensive and compelling expression in Recognizing Wrongs, a book that deserves and will surely receive the sustained attention of every scholar of torts and private law theory. It is a major achievement.

Like corrective justice accounts of tort law first developed by Jules Coleman and Ernest Weinrib in the 1980s, on which their theory builds, Goldberg and Zipursky are attentive to tort law's surface features and structure as well as the modes of argument judges use in reasoning about and applying it. Comprised as it is of relational duties correlated to rights, tort law is a law of wrongs on their view. Thus tort suits have a bipolar structure in which a plaintiff seeks to vindicate her legal rights against a defendant whom she claims has violated them. Judicial opinions corroborate this conception, according to Goldberg and Zipursky, for when judges adjudicate disputes in the law of torts, they focus on the parties to the dispute and on the doctrinal elements of the relevant tort connecting the litigants. Tort law is not some (poorly-designed) regulatory regime best explained or justified by its advancement of social goals, as instrumental law-and-economics accounts contend. It is fundamentally a law of wrongs.

Despite joining corrective justice theories in locating relational duties and wrongs at the center of tort law, Goldberg and Zipursky nevertheless depart from them, perhaps most prominently in their understanding of tort law's remedial wing. They have dubbed this aspect of their overall view "civil recourse theory." What are the differences? First, Goldberg and Zipursky highlight a distinct Hohfeldian legal relation. Instead of focusing on the plaintiff's right and the defendant's duty, they emphasize the plaintiff's power and the defendant's corresponding liability. Corrective justice accounts make it seem as if a defendant who has violated a plaintiff's right has, ipso facto, a duty to compensate. While no lawsuit gets off the ground until a plaintiff's right is allegedly violated, that alleged violation does not trigger a duty to compensate. Rather, the plaintiff acquires a power to hail the defendant into court to answer for the alleged violation, which pairs with the defendant's liability to so appear and answer. On Goldberg and Zipursky's view, tort law provides plaintiffs with a state-sanctioned forum in which to vindicate themselves against those whom they claim have wronged them -- tort law, in short, provides civil recourse.

Goldberg and Zipursky also depart from corrective justice theories in how they conceive of the substance of the redress. This takes three forms. First, while compensatory damages are the most common form of redress that plaintiffs seek, they hardly exhaust tort law's means of recourse -- injunctive relief and punitive damages count, too. To the extent that corrective justice theories revolve around compensatory damages, their scope is too narrow. Second, even when focusing on compensatory damages, the standard used in awarding them is not a "make whole" standard, but a "fair and reasonable" standard. Given the diversity of torts, a "make whole" standard simply is not up to the job. And in any case, an award of money can only restore so much. There is no "correction." Third and finally, corrective justice theories err in understanding a damages award as the defendant's next-best means of complying with a violated primary duty. Paying a damages award is rarely the next-best way now to perform a breached duty. Damages awards are better explained by a new-found accountability based on what the defendant did to the plaintiff.

Goldberg and Zipursky deepen, extend, and contextualize these claims in Recognizing Wrongs as well as stake out new ground, elaborating on their interpretive methodology along the way. After an introduction, the book is divided into three parts: Civil Recourse, The Wrongs of Tort Law, and Wrongs and Recourse in Context. In light of what readers here will find most interesting, I focus this review on Parts I and II, which is where Goldberg and Zipursky develop the fundamentals of their philosophical position. I will conclude by examining how and the extent to which Goldberg and Zipursky justify tort law.

Part I opens by defining four features of any tort. First, a tort represents a type of interpersonal interaction "that has been recognized as a wrong in an authoritative legal source" (27). Second, torts are injury-inclusive wrongs insofar as "Every tort involves a person injuring another person in some way, or failing to prevent another's injury" (28). Third, and echoing Palsgraf v. Long Island Railroad, torts are relational wrongs, in that "Each tort identifies conduct that is not merely wrongful in the sense of being antisocial, but wrongful as to a particular person or wrongful as to each member of a defined group of persons" (28). Finally, all torts are civilly actionable, for "the commission of a tort renders the tortfeasor vulnerable not to the state per se but to the victim (or her representative), who in turn can invoke the power of the courts in pursuing her claim" (29).

With this outline in hand, Goldberg and Zipursky take up the maxim ubi just ibi remedium -- where there is a right, there is a remedy -- and argue that, though maligned as an empty platitude, it is actually a deep insight that has been infused into American law from the beginning and animates tort law. Indeed, they call it "the principle of civil recourse" (31). In their view, a failure to "take the language of tort law at face value and to recognize the concepts of wrong, right, and duty within it" (46) have led many leading approaches to tort law to abandon the ubi jus maxim in favor of a "demoralized" (50) approach that mistakenly treats tort law as a form of regulatory law. A commitment to the method of "pragmatic conceptualism," however, which takes the language and concepts of tort law seriously, reveals tort law to be a coherent, purposive, and morally attractive body of law.

Goldberg and Zipursky know that these commitments make them outliers among American tort scholars. Reductive, instrumental, and purportedly amoral regulatory accounts of torts have been ascendant in the United States for a century and rule today. The original sinner is Oliver Wendell Holmes Jr., who sought to see past the moralized veneer of legal language. There is a "danger," Holmes wrote, "both to speculation and to practice, of confounding morality with law," and a corresponding "trap which legal language lays for us on that side of our way." He concluded that "the black-letter man may be the man of the present, but the man of the future is the man of statistics and the master of economics."[1] Holmes's worldview found a champion decades later in William Prosser, a leading torts scholar and Reporter for the influential second Restatement of Torts, and later still in the law-and-economics movement. But according to Goldberg and Zipursky, that influence has been distorting. Viewed through the lens of their pragmatic conceptualism, which owes debts to Coleman, Weinrib, and Robert Brandom, tort law is "quite plainly an integrated, rule-and-principle-driven system of doing and saying" (76) that stands to be illuminated by understanding "the usages that drive these practices" (77), for "the norms that ground courts' patterns of inference actually constitute the common law of torts" (78). Explaining tort law, Goldberg and Zipursky contend, is "like trying to explain how the members of a community use their language. The goal is to make explicit the various patterns of thought and conduct that animate" the law (79). When one does this, they maintain, it becomes clear that tort law revolves around wrongs and their redress.

Holmes followed John Austin in subscribing to a command theory of law, holding that any legal duty could be reduced to a court-imposed sanction for doing otherwise. If this is true, however, then the ubi jus maxim is circular: remedies, after all, are court-imposed sanctions insofar as no self-interested defendant would choose to provide them voluntarily. If a remedy is imposed on a defendant for some conduct, it just means that the defendant had a "duty" to do otherwise -- legal duties are simply liability rules. Goldberg and Zipursky resist this reductive move, maintaining that legal duties can be given a non-circular interpretation, reducing neither to Holmesian sanctions nor to moral duties. They look to H. L. A. Hart for guidance, writing that a person "has a legal duty to refrain from doing A, according to Hart, as long as there exists a valid legal rule applicable to him that enjoins him not to do A" (89). Legal duties so conceived are not just liability rules in disguise, but nor are they moral duties, for legal duties exist "whenever there are conduct-enjoining rules that have the status of valid laws within a legal system" (91), and legal validity does not depend upon moral justifiability.

This Hartian conception of legal duties permits legal rights to be explicated in a way that renders the ubi jus maxim meaningful. Tort law's duties are relational in character, directing some members of a class of persons to refrain from doing something to members of some other class of persons. Those protected by these directives thereby acquire a right, and specifically, a Hohfeldian power to begin a legal proceeding against the offending party. It is this "conduct-rule theory" of rights that reveals the ubi jus maxim to be a substantive claim: "Whenever a person has been wronged by another through a violation of a relational directive, that person is entitled to be provided with a right of action by the state" (99).

Goldberg and Zipursky offer a Lockean account of why it is the state that must provide the relevant power. In their view, the ubi jus maxim "meshes well with values and commitments that have long been regarded as central to our liberal-democratic polity" (114), aptly characterized by Locke. They appeal to Locke selectively, looking past his theory of natural rights to his contractualism, writing, "our defense of the principle of civil recourse turns on an assessment of what members of a liberal-democratic polity can reasonably demand of their government as a condition of recognizing its authority" (115). No one would have reason to assent to state authority if the state would not provide for their self-defense or would not allow them to vindicate their rights, seeking reparations, should they be wronged. It is therefore incumbent on the state to define wrongs and appoint fair officials to "ensure that victims of mistreatment can obtain satisfaction from those who have mistreated them" (118), which a damages award achieves. Goldberg and Zipursky's "core normative claim," then, is that "Law that instantiates the principle of civil recourse belongs as part of the basic structure of a just society organized on liberal-democratic principles" (125). Part I concludes by challenging corrective justice accounts of why damages are owed, as outlined above.

In Part II, Goldberg and Zipursky focus on tort law's substance, defending the claim that wrongs lie at its heart. They confront three puzzles, concerning moral luck, strict liability, and who can properly sue, that seem to call into question the centrality of wrongs to tort law. The moral luck challenge is this: if tort law revolves around wrongs, then why does it hold only those who actually injure others liable? Those who are cavalier with other's lives surely are wrongdoers, too. The answer, Goldberg and Zipursky maintain, is tort law's specific injury-inclusive notion of a wrong. There may be a moral duty not to subject others to unreasonable risk, and those who violate it may be morally blameworthy, but tort law only recognizes the more limited but still authentic duty of noninjury given its concern with providing recourse to those who have suffered a rights violation.

Strict liability appears to be a poor fit within a wrongs-based framework due to prominent but uncommon cases like Rylands v. Fletcher, which attach liability even when no legal standard has been violated. Such cases, Goldberg and Zipursky concede, probably cannot be accommodated by their framework. Most strict liability in tort law, however, is only strict in the sense of being unforgiving. It may be difficult always to live up to a standard of reasonable care towards others, for example, and some of us might actually not be able to at all. But the difficulty we face in living up to that standard, or in having to forgo certain activities if we literally cannot, does not make our failure something other than a wrong.

Finally, the fact that only certain plaintiffs can file a tort suit -- what they call the "proper-plaintiff principle" -- also does not undercut tort law's claim to be wrongs-based. This is because that principle is founded on the recognition that it is a rights violation that confers on its victim the power to litigate. Insofar as the wrongs at the center of tort law are relational, only one who has been wronged can sue. That power, moreover, corresponds to a liability that makes defendants vulnerable to plaintiffs in significant ways, and such power should be conferred sparingly.

Goldberg and Zipursky next turn to leading instrumentalist accounts of tort law. Prosser believed that torts were the conjunction of a setback suffered by the plaintiff and socially undesirable conduct perpetrated by the defendant, a "fault-harm pairing" (212). A tort suit therefore achieved two goals: compensation for the plaintiff and deterrence for the defendant. In this respect, Goldberg and Zipursky say, Prosser championed a "dual instrumentalist" view. While he got the bipolar structure of a tort suit right, though, Prosser's dual instrumentalism could neither explain why we have the torts we have nor make sense of how judges reason through tort suits. Many of Prosser's critics responded to these shortcomings by simply jettisoned one half of his fault-harm pairing, vouching for some form of "single instrumentalism." These approaches, Goldberg and Zipursky maintain, are also doomed to failure. "Compensation-based tort theories understate the degree to which tort liability turns on whether the defendant has committed a wrong. Deterrence-based theories are unable to explain adequately why tort law pursues deterrence by arming victims of mistreatment, and pretty much only victims, with the power to obtain remedies from tortfeasors" (229). Their shared mistake, ironically, is giving up on the bipolar structure of a tort suit, which Prosser at least attempted to preserve. Yet Goldberg and Zipursky do not rest content with this long-standing bipolarity critique first advanced by Coleman and Weinrib. For it is not enough only to "constrain the possible ways of fleshing out tort law's wrongs," as the bipolarity critique does, a theory of tort law must also "capture and help guide judicial reasoning about what shall count as wrongs, and neither corrective justice nor civil recourse theory provides that account" (231). Goldberg and Zipursky set out to meet this challenge, following a "dual constructivist" approach.

Civil recourse theory informs the content of tort law, but it does not determine it, and nor does any antecedent moral or political theory on their view. The content of tort law derives, instead, from "a set of well-established moral judgments that the courts have elaborated" (234), ones that are by and large uncontroversial and thus socially accepted. Torts are "eligible to be described as wrongful," Goldberg and Zipursky maintain, when assessed "relative to the social norms of the community" (242). Despite its roots in positive morality, though, tort law is not some random assemblage of wrongs, for all torts "consist of mistreatments that adversely affect an aspect of another person's individual wellbeing" (236). Beginning with familiar and uncontroversial wrongs that fit this mold, judges have gradually expanded the list when pressed by litigants to do so, in light of courts' institutional competence and prevailing norms. Tort law today is thus a "constructed and curated gallery of wrongs" (238).

Goldberg and Zipursky identify four key differences between their dual constructivism and dual instrumentalism. First, and as Weinrib has famously argued, the bipolar nature of wrongdoing is "integrative" (238) in that there is no gap to close between a defendant's misconduct and the plaintiff's injury as they are correlates of one another. Second, reasoning about wrongs is "direct" (238), properly focusing on the parties to the dispute and the mediating doctrine, not on what resolution would advance the social good. Third, constructivism is "rectitudinal" (239) insofar as it identifies unacceptable forms of interpersonal interaction warranting censure. And fourth, it is "elucidative" (239) in that courts interpret (sometimes in innovative ways), not invent, tort law. Goldberg and Zipursky conclude Part II by developing and illustrating dual instrumentalism while Part III details and defends the operation of their theory on the ground.

It is difficult to imagine a more sympathetic and compelling reconstruction of tort law than Goldberg and Zipursky's. In this sense, it is a complete success: they advance their wrongs-and-recourse account of tort law, incorporating civil recourse theory, as an interpretive theory. But it is not an idle theory. In offering it they "aim to help judges navigate this sometimes daunting terrain" (269). As this suggests, theirs is also a normative project, for guiding judges in the resolution of cases is a normative affair with real-world implications for the litigants. Goldberg and Zipursky do not deny this, stating "We aim to establish not merely what tort law is, but that it is an entirely defensible feature of our liberal-democratic political and legal regime" (270). My question is the sense and extent to which they have established this.

They maintain that "the principle of civil recourse . . . figures both in our positive law and in our positive political morality and, as such, has a claim to prima facie legitimacy" (113). Calling it prima facie legitimate is an invitation to say more. Regarding the right of recourse, they do say more, justifying the right by reference to Lockean contractualism and liberal democracy. This is likely justification enough for, as Goldberg and Zipursky note, the values and commitments inherent in liberal democracy have been "subjected to, and revised in light of, serious critical reflection" (114). And in any case, it is not the job of tort theorists to defend liberal democracy. I am not convinced, however, that Goldberg and Zipursky justify the primary rights and duties that are the substance of tort law.

They are surely right that our positive law and the common law more specifically are good places to begin normative theorizing. The common law represents the accumulated guidance of thousands upon thousands of judges working over the course of hundreds of years. It would be shocking (and not a little distressing) if that case law did not encapsulate any wisdom. That that wisdom expresses conventional mores is, however, a reason not to rest content with it. It is not that the provenance of the supposed wisdom renders it unjustifiable. But it does leave it unjustified. Goldberg and Zipursky might close this justificatory gap with respect to tort law's remedial rights, but they do not, I think, close the gap with primary rights and duties. This is because they look in the wrong place.

Hart's approach to legal duties cannot get the job done because legal duties so conceived are not normative in the right way. As Goldberg and Zipursky characterize Hart's position: "Because their content is essentially injunctive and because they exist within a system that at least some members -- as a matter of sociological fact -- cogently understand to impose obligations of conduct, it is proper to speak of them as 'duty-imposing' legal rules" (96). The scare quotes are warranted. Legal duties do not impose obligations as such, they impose "obligations" -- they "bind" due to acceptance and accompanying social pressure. They are thought to bind whether they do or not. This is why Hart himself, as quoted by Goldberg and Zipursky, has to use the elliptical phrasing that legal duties "are spoken of as imposing obligations."[2] Goldberg and Zipursky are right that Hart's approach allows them to identify something that reduces to neither a liability rule nor a moral duty. But legal duties do not necessarily generate binding normative reasons, only moral duties do. Where does this leave the core of tort law?

Legal rights and duties can of course become endowed with moral force, either in conforming (closely enough) to moral ones or as adjuncts to morally justified institutions. Goldberg and Zipursky seem to disagree, believing that their anti-foundationalist inferentialism suffuses their compelling explication of tort law with moral force. But they do not entirely walk that walk. After all, then why bother with a contractualist justification of remedial rights? Is not the fact that recourse is a settled feature of our law, widely accepted as justified, enough to justify it? It may be that Goldberg and Zipursky believe remedial rights stand in greater need of justification than primary rights, for as they say, the substance of tort law "is arguably its least mysterious feature" (266). But here I think we may just disagree. Controversy remains about, for example, the precise relational character of torts (even among those who believe all torts are relational), whether wrongs are properly understood as injury-inclusive, and whether wrongs can be strict. Goldberg and Zipursky of course take up each of these issues and make their case, but they always turn up their spades at tort law's boundary. I think that they should be willing, and that they need, to keep digging.

[1] Oliver Wendell Holmes Jr., "The Path of the Law," in Aileen Kavanagh and John Oberdiek (eds.), Arguing About Law (Oxford: Routledge, 2009), p. 19 and p. 22.

[2] H. L. A. Hart, The Concept of Law (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1961), p. 84. Quoted by Goldberg and Zipursky at p. 88.