Reconceiving Pregnancy and Childcare: Ethics, Experience, and Reproductive Labor

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Amy Mullin, Reconceiving Pregnancy and Childcare: Ethics, Experience, and Reproductive Labor, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 224pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521605865.

Reviewed by James P. Sterba, University of Notre Dame


Amy Mullin's book provides a valuable discussion of pregnancy and childcare. With regard to pregnancy, she claims that we have tended to value it solely for its product and not for the experience of pregnancy itself, and this she thinks should change. She proposes to illuminate the experience of pregnancy by comparing it to other experiences men and women have. In this way, she hopes to show that even those who are not and never plan to be pregnant still have something to learn from reflecting on the experience of pregnancy. She wants to make the experience of pregnancy part of the public discourse. (34)

Mullin argues that the experience of a (wanted) pregnancy has some similarities to chosen projects like writing an academic essay or seeking to improve one's soccer game but even more similarities to illnesses or disabilities. (59ff) She notes how philosophers have downgraded pregnancy. For example, Nietzsche claims that pregnancy "fulfills all of [a woman's] desires and exhausts all her psychic energy leaving her neither the desire nor the ability to be intellectually or artistically creative." (16) She also observes how philosophers still use metaphors drawn from the experience of pregnancy and the delivery of children in their work. In this regard, she could have noted how men have in some societies actually appropriated the experience of pregnancy for themselves. This appropriation occurs when men experience a number of male "pregnancy" symptoms. In societies where this happens, it is not uncommon for the postpartum mother to return to her usual activities while the father continues to convalesce from his symbolic ordeal nursed by his wife and other members of the family.

Mullin observes that childcare is still governed by the ideology of motherhood according to which mothers meet all the emotional needs of their young children, care for their bodies, and keep them safe, while fathers provide the material resources required for this mothering work. Moreover, this childcare is meant to occur chiefly in private homes. (120) Opposed to this ideology of motherhood, Mullin favors sharing the work of childcare among a number of different caregivers. She argues that caregivers who do not provide full-time care are able to participate in a wider range of types of activities, drawing on different skills they possess and offering different kinds of experiences to the children for whom they care. Caregivers working together can learn from each other to question unreflective assumptions about children's needs and how best to meet those needs. (152) Mullin rejects the idea that mothering cannot be fully-paid-for work. (143) Against Marilyn Friedman, who wants to distinguish parent/child relationships from friendships among equals, Mullin argues that parent/child relationships even though between unequals can still have a mutuality and reciprocity to them that can give rise to a type of friendship. (169ff)

Mullin's discussion of childcare is extremely illuminating and persuasive. It would have been helpful, however, if she had described in more detail how the shared childcare she favors has been, and ideally should be, implemented in society. It would have helped to have some comparative data about the social resources that have been invested in shared childcare in different societies and how successful these different social practices have been. It would also have been interesting if Mullin had speculated in more detail about ideal patterns of social investment in childcare. This would give us a better understanding of the ideal of shared childcare that Mullin is defending here and also how we might try to implement it our own lives.

Overall, a really fine book. It is hard for me to think of anyone who wouldn't benefit from reading it.