Reconceiving Schizophrenia

Placeholder book cover

Man Cheung Chung, K.W.M. Fulford, and George Graham (eds.), Reconceiving Schizophrenia, Oxford University Press, 2007, 352pp., $55.00 (pbk.), ISBN 019852613X.

Reviewed by Dominic Murphy, California Institute of Technology


The mental life of schizophrenics includes myriad puzzling phenomena that seem to cry out for philosophical exploration. What can be going on, for example, in the poor souls who insist that other people's thoughts are occurring in their minds? They don't complain that their own thoughts have been manipulated or controlled by outsiders; what they say is that they are introspectively aware of the thoughts of others. The strain put on our ordinary conceptions of mental life by disorders of thought like these suggests a role for the philosophy of mind. Philosophers of all traditions have talked at some length about the self and our relations to what passes in our minds, and perhaps such inquiries can illuminate the pathologies of thought and selfhood that schizophrenics struggle with.

The papers in this volume touch mostly on these topics. They bring both analytic and continental philosophy, in the hands of philosophers, psychiatrists and psychologists, to bear on the strange experiences and thoughts of schizophrenics. The variety of perspectives on display reflects the many philosophical orientations that have been brought to bear on mental illness, but also means that few readers will find everything approachable. But the different perspectives do show how many different philosophical traditions have been entangled with different psychiatric projects, and they open up interesting perspectives on the issues for those who aren't familiar with them. (The philosophy of science, as opposed to the philosophy of mind, is rather slighted, though, and there is nothing from the Bachelard-Canguilhem tradition in continental philosophy of science. That tradition took an interest in biology and medicine before analytic philosophers got round to them, and might be a source of illuminating commentary on biological psychiatry.) Everyone interested in philosophy of psychiatry should work through this volume, struggling through the unfamiliar bits. The papers are uneven, but the best are very good. It is both intrinsically very interesting and also valuable for its demonstration of how rich and venerable the subject is.

The volume also includes one non-philosophical paper, Colin King's memoir of his dealings with the British mental health system as both patient and social worker. He records the indignities he suffers and worries about avoiding complicity in their perpetuation now that he is working for the system. He puts his ill-treatment down to racism -- doubtless he met plenty of it, but almost everyone going through the mental health system endures neglect and misery at some point. Rom Harré, in his paper, calls the process by which the system gathers and records information the construction of a "file-self", which stands in for a real self. Both of these papers suggest that the mental health system neglects to look at whole persons but attends to them only as members of categories. Both are against the impersonality of the system, without ever clearly saying why, let alone arguing for an alternative. Patients should be treated with dignity, of course, but some forms of mental illness undermine one's dignity all by themselves. If the mentally ill are not to be ignored, they will become patients. And if we are to have patients, we will have to have records and examinations and the whole bureaucratic regime. Sorting people into categories is not objectionable if the sorting helps people to get better, and what is the alternative? There is no way of delivering even the most personalized, sympathetic care to every mentally ill person that does not involve paperwork. And if you are worried about discrepancies of power between patient and bureaucrat, you might pause to wonder whether agitating for care that takes into account the whole person might not turn out to be a license for moralistic snooping into every area of peoples' lives. Perhaps what's needed, as Eric Matthews suggests in his paper, is a way of making room in the medical model for psychological phenomena that allows us to take the point of view of the sufferer more seriously.  But the problem with schizophrenia is that the point of view of the sufferer is very often intractable in folk psychological terms. It is hard to enter sympathetically into the lived experience of someone who reports experience in the alien terms that some schizophrenics use.

Matthews rebuts some claims made by the anti-psychiatry movement out of a general skepticism about mental illness. Jeff Poland looks at a different kind of skepticism. The very existence of schizophrenia is disputed. Schizophrenics come in many forms, and the condition evades a clear definition; its sufferers just seem to have comprehensively wrecked minds, rather than one clear and distinct deficit in some mental faculty. The history of schizophrenia is the story of successive researchers coming up with terms like "loosening of associations", "synaptic slippage" and "cognitive dysmetria", that really mean nothing more than "everything is wrong in the mind". The skeptics acknowledge that there are plenty of people with severe mental illness, but question whether there is a condition called schizophrenia which they share

Poland points out with exemplary clarity the problem with what he calls "the master argument" for this position. The master argument says that a scientific concept is only respectable if it can be defined in terms of an interrelated set of observable phenomena. From that we are supposed to derive an underlying construct that can predict other, as yet unmade, observations. For this picture of a scientific concept to apply to schizophrenia, we would have to be able to define a set of symptoms on the basis of which we could posit a measurable genetic or neurobiological abnormality. And we can't. But, as Poland says, there is no reason for us to accept the master argument's picture of scientific concepts. It would be perfectly in keeping with normal scientific practice if the concept of schizophrenia took its meaning from its role in a theoretical context. But of course, for schizophrenia to be a useful concept, the theory that determines the extension of "schizophrenia" would need to have a lot of evidence in its favor, and generally have the credentials of a flourishing, progressive, research program. Poland doubts this is the case; he identifies this philosophically more sophisticated version of the case against the schizophrenia concept in order to redirect the master argument, rather than refute it. He is just as skeptical about the reality of schizophrenia as the theorists he dissents from. He just knows more philosophy of science.

In effect, Poland denies that schizophrenia is a natural kind, for two reasons. First, he thinks that there is inadequate empirical evidence for the emerging picture of schizophrenia as a neurodevelopmental disorder; second, he thinks that the neurodevelopmental model is clinically unhelpful, since it doesn't help in clinical assessment or the design of treatment plans.

On the first point, Poland lacks the space to go over the literature thoroughly enough to make the case fully, but still I don't think he distinguishes the following two claims: 1) most claims about the causal processes responsible for schizophrenic signs and symptoms are poorly supported, and 2) we lack evidence for the general concept of schizophrenia as a pervasive neurodevelopmental disorder. I think the first claim is true but the second false -- I find the evidence for the neurodevelopmental model convincing despite the paucity of specific hypotheses. What we want is to trace a process that runs from developmental mishap, through neuroanatomy or neurophysiology, and on to behavior. But maybe there are just too many ways for the processes to unfold; lots of different mishaps could be related in a many:many fashion to states of the developing brain which in turn interact with numerous other factors to give us multiple possible outcomes.

Only a very small number of all the possible states of the mind/brain are likely to be functional states. If the developing system is knocked out of that small region of the state space then stochastic factors might determine where it ends up. There really may be no more to say about schizophrenia than that all hell breaks loose in the mind, for all sorts of reasons that have to do with the probabilistic effects of interfering with developing brains in different ways.

That would explain why there is so little clinical payoff. We would be pretty much clueless about what to do with a patient even if we knew all the possible pathways from development to symptom, because any given patient might have gone along too many of the pathways to identify the cause of their problems. Poland regards this as a reason to dispense with the schizophrenia concept altogether, but I think the problem will remain whatever we do. Severe mental illness, whatever we call it, may just be the set of almost random outcomes of myriad abnormal pathways. Poland wants a relationship between systemic failure and treatment protocol. For that to be possible, we would need to subtype severe mental illness so as to demonstrate connections between a subset of symptoms and a particular destructive process in the mind. I think that however successful we may be at doing that we will always be left with a residue of relations between pathology and symptoms that is too chaotic to be resolved. The history of attempts to derive subtypes of schizophrenia is a cause for pessimism, and I don't think our fortunes would improve if we recast the search for distinct forms of schizophrenia as the search for clinically useful types of severe mental illness.

However, that doesn't mean that anatomizing components of the schizophrenia syndrome is not worth doing, and the most interesting and productive part of Reconceiving Schizophrenia is the group of papers that discuss delusion, which has a prominent role in schizophrenia and other ailments. This part of the book should be read by anyone who wants to see where the debate over delusion has got to.

Delusions are notoriously hard to define. The accepted version construes them as false beliefs, but with distinctive properties, such as being bizarre, being central to one's inferential network, or being impossible to dislodge by the force of the better argument.  It is the connection between delusion and belief that occupies several of the contributors. Lynn Stephens and George Graham make the strongest theoretical claim, proposing that delusions are not, like paradigmatic beliefs, directed at the world at all. Rather, they argue that delusions express a characteristic higher-order "stance" towards the contents of one's own mind. Just as I can believe that I believe that P, so I can take a delusional attitude towards a first-order thought. These first order thoughts might be beliefs, but they might be other attitudes too. The benefit of letting the delusional stance range over attitudes besides belief is that the theory then has the resources to solve a notorious problem, which is that many deluded people simply do not act the way you'd expect them to if they really believed their delusions. Patients assert that their food is poisoned but still eat it, or insist that the world will soon end but contemplate universal extinction with apparent equanimity. (Andy Hamilton's paper covers this ground ably in arguing that there is no fact of the matter as to whether delusions are beliefs.) But if one can take a delusional stance to all sorts of attitudes, including belief but also including merely entertaining a thought, then the links between delusion and action should be no more uniform than the links between thought (including mere surmise) and action generally.

This result is an important achievement, but Stephens and Graham are much less clear when they try to characterize exactly what the delusional stance is, such that one can take it up with respect to first-order states. I worry that without a clearer statement of what the delusional stance is, Stephens and Graham have just shifted the problem of getting straight on delusions up from the first level to the meta-level, and that the problem of defining delusion is still with us, only now it's the problem of defining the delusional stance. Still, the move to higher-order states might open up a promising approach to explaining delusions in terms of failures of introspective monitoring; as they note, such failures have often been conjectured as an important proximate cause of schizophrenia.

The paper by Kinderman and Bentall dissents from several others here by arguing robustly that delusions are indeed strongly held beliefs, or at least, that they cannot be neatly distinguished from beliefs. They argue instead, somewhat in the spirit of Jaspers, that the key to understanding delusions is the role they play in the mental life of the subject. In particular, they think that many delusions are retained because to give them up would be too psychologically costly. Their central case is paranoia, which is also discussed in relation to delusion by Jennifer Radden. Radden adds to the attacks on the delusion-as-belief thesis, and attacks the whole project of seeking epistemic analyses of psychosis as unfruitful and outmoded faculty psychology. She recommends thinking of persecutory paranoia as a form of morbid distrust. Delusions in general, she thinks, are collections of mixed affective and cognitive attitudes, distinguished from one another by being directed onto particular states of affairs.

These papers on delusion and psychosis, put together, comprise a manifesto for redirecting the study of delusion away from a focus on deviant epistemic processes and towards a broader picture of its role in our mental economy and its relations to emotion and self-knowledge. Gillett comes closest among these authors to thinking of psychosis as a clean epistemic break with external reality, but even he situates the break in the context of the difficulties of weaving together a narrative self, and putting both delusion and belief in the service of establishing one's identity. This downplaying of purely epistemic theories of delusion is welcome, and has the effect of moving analytic philosophy of psychiatry closer to the phenomenological tradition, which starts from experience rather than belief formation. I will now say something about the papers in the volume that work in this tradition, which has long been intimately related to European psychiatry.

In a very rich paper, Louis Sass and Josef Perner argue that understanding the phenomenology of schizophrenia can have an explanatory role as well as a descriptive one. It is not just that phenomenology can help us to understand the experiences of schizophrenic patients, or distinguish the components of psychotic experience more closely. Rather, they see their theory as elucidating some mental processes that interrelate so as to give rise to the experience of schizophrenia and account for subsequent changes in those experiences. Their defense of a distinctively phenomenological explanatory style is clever and subtle, and will be an instructive route into phenomenological approaches for readers with heavy analytic baggage. But, as in the other phenomenological chapters, I worry that their attempt to understand the nature of schizophrenic experience is too coarse-grained and misses the sheer weirdness of what's going on. Let me give an example.

Sass and Perner offer the most hard-thought phenomenological account here. They stress the importance of "disturbed ipseity" in schizophrenia, by which they mean an extreme degree of attentiveness to experience, rather than the world that experience represents, together with a decline in one's sense of oneself as a unified subject of awareness. This sounds like it captures some aspects of schizophrenia, but it also sounds like it refers to other people too. For instance, there are accomplished visual artists who are minutely sensitive to the way objects affect them in experience, and other people who worry about their own motives and thoughts so much as to become almost paralysed, to lose their sense of being able to act in the world. These may be unusual or even morbid states of mind, but they fall short of psychosis.

In general, the phenomenological papers here seem either to erect a structure of interpretation that includes too many other cases or to settle for simply redescribing the testimony of schizophrenics in unhelpfully general categories (like "abnormal self-awareness"). Disturbances of experience, or perceptual and motor abnormalities, are at the heart of phenomenological accounts of schizophrenia. But they are not just limited to schizophrenics; there are plenty of sensorimotor disorders that don't have the attendant phenomena that we see in schizophrenia, and I have suggested that a lot of perfectly sane people are nonetheless occasionally prone to morbid relations to their own experience. Something needs to be added to these accounts to capture the bizarre nature of schizophrenia, but its very strangeness means that language, no matter how scrupulous, always seems to fall short of it.