Reconceiving Spinoza

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Samuel Newlands, Reconceiving Spinoza, Oxford University Press, 2018, 283pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198817260.

Reviewed by Martin Lin, Rutgers University, New Brunswick


Spinoza holds both that there is only one substance, God or nature, and that an endless diversity pertains to it. This diversity is manifested in two ways. First, Spinoza believes that God has infinitely many attributes, including both thought and extension. Second, from each of these attributes follow infinitely many modes (Spinoza's term for beings that don't belong to the category of substance), which inhere in and are conceived through the one substance. These doctrines raise many puzzles. In the Cartesian philosophy from which Spinoza draws his ontological terminology, an attribute is the essence of the substance to which it belongs. But if this is how Spinoza understands the attributes, how can a single substance have infinitely many attributes? Surely a substance can have at most one essence. And how can all of the nonsubstantial beings in the world inhere in the same substance? On the natural assumption that inherence entails predication, would this not result in incoherent predications? For example, some nonsubstantial bodies are cubes and some are not, but, if they were all modes that inhere in God, would this not entail that God is a cube and God is not a cube? This objection might be easily avoided if Spinoza allowed that God had parts. Then we could say that one part of God is a cube and one part of God is not. But Spinoza is adamant that God has no parts (1p15s). For these reasons, many of Spinoza's readers have doubted that his thesis that there is only one substance with infinitely many attributes and in which all else inheres is coherent, much less plausible.

In his bold and ambitious book, Samuel Newlands develops a new and systematic interpretation of Spinoza's metaphysics that attempts to address such concerns. According to him, Spinoza can consistently hold that there is only one substance that has infinitely many attributes and in which all else inheres because he identifies the various ways in which diversity pertains to the one substance with different ways of conceiving the same thing. Because a single referent can satisfy many concepts, we cannot infer a multiplicity of referents from a multiplicity of concepts. In other words, concepts are more fine-grained than referents. Newlands maintains that this fineness of grain allows Spinoza to answer all of the challenges faced by the combination of his substance monism and his attribute and mode pluralism.

Newlands begins by arguing that Spinoza's metaphysics is motivated by a certain conception of perfection on which something is perfect just in case it exhibits maximal unity combined with maximal diversity, in other words, it combines both parsimony and plentitude to the highest degree. The second chapter outlines in very general terms what Newlands calls Spinoza's conceptualist strategy for dealing with the problems that appear to prevent him from having both parsimony and plentitude. The third chapter argues that all dependence relations -- causation, inherence, existential dependence, following from, and many others -- are, for Spinoza, identical to relations of conceptual dependence. The fourth chapter focuses on Spinoza's theory of modality and argues that the modal properties of a thing are, for Spinoza, a matter of how that thing is conceived. The fifth chapter claims that, for Spinoza, each thing has infinitely many essences, both across and within the attributes and attempts to show that, as in the case of dependence relations and modal properties, what the essence of a thing is depends on how it is conceived. In the sixth chapter, Newlands applies his conceptualist strategy to the question of the individuation of the modes, arguing that individuation is, for Spinoza, a conceptual matter. In chapter seven, Newlands turns his attention to the implications of his interpretation for Spinoza's moral theory and argues that, although every individual is motivated by self-interest, Spinoza's theory of individuation shows how we can have self-interested reasons to further the interests of others. Chapter eight extends Newlands' discussion of Spinoza's moral theory by arguing that, although every way of conceiving a given individual is equally accurate, we have prudential reasons for preferring some ways of conceiving of them over others. In particular, when it comes to conceiving ourselves, some ways depict us as more powerful and stable than others, which, given Spinoza's moral psychology, gives us a motive to prefer them. In the ninth and final chapter, Newlands responds to the worry that his conceptualist interpretation of Spinoza turns him into a kind of idealist by arguing that, despite its psychological overtones, Spinoza's talk of "ways of conceiving" should not be understood as a mental act. Rather, we should understand concepts, in Spinoza, as somehow attribute neutral.

Let us look at Newlands' conceptualist strategy interpretation in more detail, starting with the problem of how a single substance can have more than one attribute, for example, both thought and extension. Spinoza thinks that thought and extension are radically distinct and must be conceived independently from one another (1p10). What reason, then, could we have for supposing that a single substance could have both? What could tie such radically distinct ways of being together in a single subject? Newlands' answer is that different attributes are just different ways of conceiving the same substance and thus, because concepts are more fine-grained than referents, we cannot infer a diversity of substances from a diversity of attributes (p. 49). What is more, it is precisely because of their radical dissimilarity that we can be sure that both attributes can belong to a single substance. According to Spinoza, an attribute must be conceived through itself and its concept does not imply the concept of any other attribute. Because of this lack of conceptual connectedness, no contradiction can arise from conceiving of a single substance as having multiple attributes. Moreover, because, according to Newlands' interpretation, Spinoza identifies the attributes with ways of conceiving of a substance, whether or not a substance has an attribute depends on how it is conceived. Next, Newlands thinks that Spinoza infers from the sensitivity of attribute predications to how a substance is conceived, that a single thing can have a multiplicity of attributes insofar as it can be conceived of in a multiplicity of consistent ways. This, Newlands maintains, is Spinoza's solution to the problem of parsimony and plentitude as it pertains to substances and their attributes.

Newlands abstracts from this a general template for solving the problem of parsimony and plentitude in Spinoza: For any feature or relation problematic for the reconciliation of parsimony and plentitude, F, identify it with a "conceptual feature". From this identification, infer Conceptual Sensitivity: whether or not x is F depends on how x is conceived. And from Conceptual Sensitivity infer Consistent Conceptual Variability: if whether or not x is F depends on how it is conceived, then it is possible for x to be F and not-F. From Consistent Conceptual Variability the reconciliation of parsimony and plentitude is supposed to follow.

This template raises many questions. What is a "conceptual feature"? Is it a feature of concepts or is it a feature of the things which satisfy the concept? Why does Consistent Conceptual Variability follow from Conceptual Sensitivity? The consistency of affirming different attributes of the same substances was underwritten by the fact that the concept of an attribute does not bear any conceptual relations to the concept of any other attribute. But this does not entail that one substance can be extended and not extended. It only ensures that statements such as that the one substance is extended and thinking will not entail a contradiction. What is more, in addition to inter-attribute plentitude, there is supposed to be intra-attribute plentitude. What guarantees that the conceptual variability that we find within an attribute will be consistent?

Examination of additional applications of the strategy will shed light on these questions. Let us first consider its application to a well-known problem generated by the following three putative Spinozisitc doctrines: (1) every idea stands in causal relations to other ideas and every body stands in causal relations to other bodies; (2) no idea stands in causal relations to any bodies and no body stands in causal relations to any ideas; (3) every idea is identical to some body and every body is identical to some mind. This is obviously an inconsistent triad. Take an idea i that stands in causal relations to other ideas. By (3), there is some body b that is identical to i. Thus, by Leibniz's Law, b stands in causal relations to some ideas, which contradicts (2). Newlands claims that Spinoza solves this problem by applying his conceptualist strategy (p. 51-52). He identifies causal relations with conceptual relations. What it is for x to cause y just is for the concept of y to contain the concept of x. When a mode is conceived as an idea, the concept employed contains the concept of other ideas but not the idea of other bodies. When a mode is conceived as a body, the relevant concept contains the concepts of other bodies but not ideas. Thus, a mode conceived of as an idea is caused by other ideas and not bodies and the same mode conceived of as a body is caused by other bodies but not ideas.

Now we are in a position to answer some the questions raised previously. For example, we now know what Newlands means by a "conceptual feature". Causation is identified with a conceptual feature: conceptual containment. Containing a concept is a feature of concepts. Thus, a conceptual feature is a feature of concepts. In other words, the first stage of the conceptualist strategy, Conceptual Identification, involves identifying what appears to be features of objects with features of the concepts satisfied by those objects.

The solution also explains why Newlands thinks that Consistent Conceptual Variability follows from Conceptual Sensitivity. Truths about causation are reducible to truths about conceptual containment. Thus, when we say, for example, that a mode is both caused by bodies and not caused by bodies, what we mean is that a concept applies to it which contains concepts of bodies and that a different concept applies to it which does not contain concepts of bodies. There is nothing incoherent about that.

Newlands does not stop with his claim that Spinoza identifies causation with conceptual containment. He further argues that all dependence relations, for Spinoza, are reducible to conceptual containment. In particular, he argues that causation, inherence, existing in virtue of, and following from are all identical to conceptual containment: x inhering in y just is the concept of x containing the concept of y, etc. Moreover, he holds that inherence entails predication so that if x inheres in y, then x is predicated of y. He also says that predication exhibits Conceptual Sensitivity (p. 49), which strongly suggests that he identifies predication with conceptual containment. He calls this collection of theses "conceptual dependence monism" and argues that it is motivated by Spinoza's commitment to both parsimony and plentitude. Conceptual dependence monism, he says, "shows, in effect, how the One can have the metaphysical structure of the Many" (p. 88).

Also revealing is how Newlands thinks Spinoza applies the conceptualist strategy to modal predications. This is an important topic that bears on the question of whether or not Spinoza is a necessitarian. In particular, commentators have been puzzled by the fact that, in some texts (e.g., 1p17s and 1p29), Spinoza appears to assert that there is nothing contingent in nature, but in other texts (e.g. 2a1), he appears to assert the opposite. On Newlands' interpretation, Spinoza appeals to a distinction between a mode's Broad Concept (BC) and its Narrow Concept (NC). A mode's BC contains its relationship to all other modes, whereas its NC contains only concepts of its intrinsic features. (There are also, on Newlands' interpretation, intermediary concepts that lie between the pure BCs and the pure NCs.) For Spinoza, if something follows from something necessary, then it itself is necessary. On Newland's interpretation, the following-from relation is identified with conceptual containment. In other words, that x follows from y is nothing other than that the concept of x contains the concept of y. Thus, if the concept of something contains something necessary, then it itself is necessary. Spinoza denies that any individual finite mode follows from the absolute nature of God but claims that infinite modes do. As Don Garrett has persuasively argued, the totality of finite modes is itself an infinite mode, which, as such, follows from the absolute nature of God.[1] Thus, a mode's BC, which includes the concept of the totality of finite things, includes something that includes the concept of the absolute nature of God. This means that, when conceived of in terms of its BC, a finite mode is necessary. A finite mode's NC does not include the concept of the absolute nature of God or any other necessary thing and thus, when a finite mode is conceived of in terms of its NC, it is contingent. Consequently, Spinoza's claims -- that everything is necessary and that some things are contingent--  are consistent because they are making claims about different concepts and what they do and do not contain.

As ingenious as Newlands' conceptualist strategy interpretation is, I believe that it neither captures Spinoza's intentions nor makes philosophical sense of Spinoza's system. Showing that it does not capture Spinoza's intentions would involve a protracted exegetical argument that I cannot undertake here, so I will confine myself to some remarks on its philosophical tenability. A preliminary objection (one that might not go to the heart of Newlands' conceptualist interpretation but perhaps only to his execution of it) is that he sometimes makes contradictory claims about what is contained in what. For example, he says that, for Spinoza, "Necessarily, for all x and y, x is conceived through y iff y causes x iff x is in y." (p. 60) He also says that "if x is conceived through y then the concept of y is involved or contained in the concept of x." But then he says "speaking in metaphysical rigor, the features in a thing's essential base, [a], conceptually contain its essential effects, [b], and it is in virtue of this containment that those features constitute its essence." (p. 118) But if the concept of a thing's essence contains its essential effects, then those effects are also (by the biconditional stated on p. 60) its causes. This is incompatible with the fact that causation is, for Spinoza, an anti-symmetric dependence relation and thus a thing's effects cannot also be its causes. Newlands makes a similar mistake when he claims that, according to his interpretation, "the future is conceptually contained in the past." (p. 84) Given the necessary biconditionals imputed by Newlands to Spinoza, this would entail that the past is caused by the future, which is neither a Spinozistic doctrine nor an independently plausible thesis about the direction of dependence. Perhaps even more troubling, as noted earlier, on Newlands' interpretation, a mode's BC contains the concept of every other thing. Thus, every finite mode would stand as cause and effect to every other finite mode, which also violates the anti-symmetry condition on dependence relations. Moreover, everything would inhere in everything else and, thus, everything would be predicated of everything else. These are obviously unacceptable consequences.

A more general concern about Newlands' interpretation concerns the intelligibility of the claim that causation, inherence, predication, etc. are identical to relations of conceptual containment. One reason to doubt its intelligibility is that it leaves mysterious that in virtue of what objects satisfy concepts. A thing standing in various causal relations is nothing but one of its concepts including other concepts. A thing having a certain intrinsic property is nothing but one of its concepts including another concept. What then makes it the case that these concepts are concepts of that thing? It cannot be any feature of that thing because inherence and predication are themselves just conceptual relations. Likewise, it cannot be any structural role played by the thing because those too are just structural features of the concepts. Once dependence relations, including inherence and the predications entailed by them, are offloaded from the objects onto the concepts, there isn't anything left in the objects to be represented by the concepts.

Newlands is sensitive to this concern and, at various points in the book, he attempts to engage with the question of the relationship between concepts and their objects. At one point, he claims that they must characterize their objects, which he glosses in Spinozistic terms as that they must "express" their objects (p. 21). But he then proceeds to give an account of expression in terms of conceptual containment (p. 23), which obviously puts us back where we started. At another point, he claims that we should not think of the relationship between concepts and their objects as a representational one. Rather, concepts are ways in which the objects themselves are structured (p. 249). But then it is difficult to see how the conceptualist strategy is supposed to yield Consistent Conceptual Variability, according to which it is possible for one and the same thing to be both F and not-F. If concepts are just the structures of things themselves, then Consistent Conceptual Variability would be tantamount to the claim that a thing can be structured so that it is both F and not-F. Newlands sometimes frankly admits that problems such as these loom for his interpretation and concludes that Spinoza's project is flawed, suggesting that this might be a reason to find Spinoza's philosophy even more interesting than it would be otherwise (p. 250). I have no quarrel with finding flawed philosophies interesting or with thinking that Spinoza's philosophy is flawed. I am not persuaded, however, that Spinoza's philosophy is flawed in just the way that it would be on Newlands' interpretation because I believe that there are alternative interpretations which impute fewer global flaws to it and which have a more explicit basis in Spinoza's text.

Having read Newlands' book, it is clear to me that he is a skilled and resourceful philosopher and his argument is a creative attempt to deal with some of the deepest problems in Spinoza's philosophy. In the end, however, the conceptualist strategy cannot successfully reconcile parsimony and plentitude. Either we are left with conceptual plentitude and metaphysical parsimony that, while perhaps peacefully coexisting, do not have enough to do with one another to count as being reconciled or a reconciliation accomplished by brute force in the face of all the contradictions that supposedly motivated the strategy in the first place. Just as if the conceptualist strategy had succeeded, its success would have given us a reason to accept it, its failure provides us with a reason to search for alternative interpretations.

[1] Don Garrett, "Spinoza's Necessitarianism," in God and Nature in Spinoza's Metaphysics, ed. Yirmiyahu Yovel (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1991).