Reconciling Our Aims: In Search of Bases for Ethics

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Allan Gibbard, Reconciling Our Aims: In Search of Bases for Ethics, Oxford UP, 2008, 193pp., $25.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195370423.

Reviewed by James Lenman, University of Sheffield



Moral questions are questions about what to do, and questions about what to do are not empirical questions about the natural world. They are questions that call for practical decision as opposed to factual inquiry. Many facts may inform those decisions but these are not moral facts; except perhaps in some deflated, quasi-realist sense, there are no moral facts. These questions are, as Gibbard puts it planning questions, more particularly planning questions about when and to what extent to feel such characteristically moral sentiments as guilt or resentment. Such planning inescapably involves intuitions but these should not be understood as the operations of “a kind of inner eye that peers into the non-natural layout of moral facts” (p. 21). Rather to have an intuition to the effect that something, suffering say, is of moral importance is to confidently give its consideration weight in our planning. What we are confident of here is that this disposition to give weight is one we would retain in ideal conditions for planning. That doesn’t make the issue straightforwardly empirical however, for what conditions are ideal is itself a planning question.

These are the main claims Gibbard defends in the first of his three Tanner Lectures delivered at Berkeley in 2006, reproduced here with comments by Michael Bratman, John Broome and Frances Kamm and with Gibbard’s responses to them. Largely this first lecture recapitulates in summary metaethical ideas that will be broadly familiar to readers of his splendid Thinking How to Live. I won’t say more about them here. Apart from a few niceties of emphasis and detail, I think them more or less all true.

In the two lectures that follow, Gibbard’s attention shifts from metaethics to normative ethics. Here he runs an ambitious argument that borrows its starting point from the contractualist writings of T. M. Scanlon but takes that starting point in the very unScanlonian direction of utilitarianism. The Scanlonian starting point is that “[t]he point of morality… is to live with each other on a basis that none of us could reasonably reject” (p. 41). As Gibbard develops this idea, an objection to some moral practice is to be supposed unreasonable when this practice is one to which the objector would have agreed under fair conditions. Gibbard departs from Scanlon in interpreting fair conditions by reference to a veil of ignorance. What cannot be reasonably rejected are rules to which we would have agreed under a veil of ignorance, where we do not know which individual we are to be and assign an equal probability to being any given individual.

Once that conception of fair conditions is in place, the argument of the second lecture essentially follows the first of John Harsanyi’s two classic utilitarian theorems in yielding a form of utilitarianism. If I’m equally likely to be anyone and I satisfy the standard decision theoretic conditions for rationality, I’ll maximize my expected utility by going for the moral code that will yield the highest possible average utility. The complication that most exercises Gibbard here is the interpretation, in this context, of utility, impressed as he is by Scanlon’s arguments that the notion of welfare is considerably less straightforward than many moral theorists have been apt to suppose.

Scanlon would not, of course, accept this conception of fair conditions for agreement. John Rawls partly did, agreeing that agreement behind a veil of ignorance was indeed central, but dissenting from Harsanyi in depriving the contracting parties of any information about the probability of being a given individual (or more precisely, in Rawls’ case, of occupying any given position in society). So while Harsanyi’s social contract delivers utilitarianism, Rawls’ yields a form of prioritarianism, seeking to maximize the expectations of the worst-off social group. His basic rationale for doing this was that the principles that Rawlsian contracting parties will choose cohere better, or so at least he urged, with basic moral intuitions about freedom and social justice than do utilitarian principles. This can sometimes look to beginning students of Rawls rather like cheating, fiddling around with the initial conditions to get the desired result, but that is to misunderstand his methodology. For Rawls the derivation of the principles from the description of the Original Position isn’t intended to have the force of a theorem, proving we must accept the proposed principles on pain of some kind of decision-theoretic incoherence. Rather the Original Position serves as a device of representation, modelling the conception of justice believed by Rawls to be most plausibly vindicated in the court of reflective equilibrium. This kind of two way traffic between highly general ideas about how best to model social rationality and our considered judgements about particular cases is exactly how the method of reflective equilibrium is supposed to work.

What Gibbard would contest here is whether the anti-utilitarian intuitions to which his Rawlsian and otherwise anti-utilitarian opponents would appeal at this level are really so compelling. Sometimes, as he emphasizes, abstract decision-theoretic arguments can conflict with widespread intuitive judgements in ways which, on close critical inspection, leave the conflicting intuitions looking discredited; Gibbard illustrates this point with reference to a classic example of Richard Zeckhauser’s involving Russian roulette (pp. 27-29). Further, sometimes such intuitions may be explained in ways that will tend to debunk them. Thus we might think with Gilbert Harman that many of the intuitions that are thought to support a putative moral distinction between killing and letting die reflect the disproportionate influence in the social evolution of our moral thought of relatively powerful and prosperous people more concerned about security from attack than they were that a failure of charity on the part of others would leave them to starve. Or we might think with Gibbard that many of the endless intuitions about life-endangering trolleys that anti-utilitarian writers are given to eliciting reflect a natural but, under rational scrutiny, not very morally compelling, relative squeamishness about killing people at relatively close quarters and in relatively hands-on ways (p. 185). We might further, as Gibbard does in replying to Kamm, follow Hare’s favourite strategy regarding supposed difficulties for utilitarianism over, e.g., slavery by urging that “taking the possibility seriously that it might maximize nonmoral good would involve either a blindness to what slavery is, or a view that our snap intuitions respond correctly even to fantastic situations” (p. 156). Sometimes again appeals to counter-utilitarian intuitions might be accused of begging the question. Gibbard thinks appeals to respect are like this, following William Frankena in arguing that “the content of morality must be settled in order to determine what constitutes treating a person with respect, so that the demands of respect can’t be the basis of morality” (p. 56). Gibbard finds this thought telling against much in the style of argumentation favoured by Kamm (see pp. 154-5).

While Gibbard defends the utilitarian position very ably, my own sympathies remain with Rawls and, to some extent, Kamm. A basic difficulty for utilitarians is that, given the choice between an outcome — call it A — where you have loads and loads of fun and I have no fun at all and an outcome — B — where we both have considerable fun, the utilitarian is committed to A being the more eligible so long as the total amount of fun in A is higher. Of course we would agree in preferring A behind a Harsanyi-style veil where we were concerned solely to maximize our expected prospect of fun, but that only serves to make such a veil look pretty dubious as a way to model fair conditions of agreement. Of course, too, where we are concerned with the distribution of, say, income, we can always fiddle about with the shape of the utility function for money in ways that will accommodate egalitarian intuitions but this isn’t so easy for fun (see pp. 156-158). Fun, after all, just is utility, or at least for classical utilitarians it is, while modern utilitarians, like Gibbard, who want it to be something subtler, can simply substitute whatever that is for fun in the example to find themselves in much the same pickle.

Gibbard’s third lecture shifts the main focus from the first to the second of Harsanyi’s two utilitarian theorems. Or, rather, it spells out a piece of formal reasoning that Gibbard represents as drawing its inspiration from it, the “tangent theorem”, as Broome calls it in the course of his rather negative evaluation of its ethical significance. The dispute Gibbard hopes this reasoning will help adjudicate is between two conceptions of the ideal social contract. The first, modest, conception is one that allows us to pursue our various particular and often conflicting aims in the decidedly partial way we typically do but places various moral constraints on how we go about this. The second demands instead, far less modestly, that we pursue a common set of aims, one that gives equal weight to the interests and concerns of each of us. Gibbard thinks his reasoning shows that the former conception where our aims (or, as he calls them, “goal scales”) are permitted to diverge will be incoherent and this is a problem. Now of course if our aims diverge, they can always come into conflict and conflicting aims are, together, incoherent in the basic sense that they cannot all be realized, but that can’t be quite the problem (cf. p. 29). If I want Scotland to win the next World Cup and you want France to, we have aims which can’t both be realized but that is just another way to say they conflict and, with a sport like football, that is rather the point. The dimension of putative incoherence that Gibbard emphasizes here is that, as his theorem aims to make vivid, where our aims diverge there is always the troubling possibility of prisoner’s dilemmas:

That is to say, there will be cases where one prospect X comes out higher on everyone’s goal-scale than does another prospect Y, but where if each of us guides his choices by his own scale, we will end up with prospect Y. We could, in such a case, have agreed on a shared goal scale that would end us up with X… . This seems an incoherent way to arrange our lives, a way with no intelligible rationale. (p. 65)

Now I confess that, for reasons which would be pretty familiar to readers of Bernard Williams, I’m inclined to find the idea that we could be required to have fully convergent aims bizarre and fantastic and I’m not yet fully convinced how worried I should be by this reasoning on Gibbard’s part.

To keep things simple let’s take a straightforward and commonplace example where aims diverge and indeed directly conflict. Suppose that Troilus and Diomedes are both enamoured of Cressida. Each wants to win her favours. Moreover, as the favours that each seeks to win are of a stable and monogamous character, these aims directly conflict. Here what the modest conception will say is that both may retain and pursue their respective, diverging aims but they may pursue them only in morally constrained ways. Thus if Troilus thinks it would advance his cause were he to abduct Cressida or if Diomedes thinks his life would be easier if he were to kill Troilus, it is obviously not OK for them to do these things. Given these and other constraints, however, the modest conception tells them it is OK strenuously and competitively to pursue their diverging aims. With the constraints in place the natural way for them to do this will be for each of them to try (without resorting to deception or other morally problematic forms of manipulation) to make Cressida like him more than she does his rival, leaving it up to her to then decide which, if either, she fancies taking up with. If that is what the modest conception says, the modest conception seems really rather sensible, at least to me. So what is the problem?

Well, there are two outcomes that are the respective targets of our heroes’ aims:

T: Troilus prevails over Diomedes by fair means.

D: Diomedes prevails over Troilus by fair means.

These outcomes diverge and indeed conflict. They are not jointly realizable. Troilus prefers T over D. Diomedes prefers D over T. (For simplicity let’s just ignore what Cressida might prefer. Gibbard is relaxed about making this kind of simplifying move in his own main example so I will be too (see p. 158).) The problem Gibbard emphasizes is that there is now the possibility of a prisoner’s dilemma. So let us people this world with a utilitarian demon bent on illustrating Gibbard’s point and let us suppose this demon so arranges things that Troilus and Diomedes must each make a choice. Troilus must either push button X or push button Y. Diomedes must either push button A or push button B. These decisions are to be made independently. The Demon has kindly provided them both with a table explaining what causal upshots he has, never mind quite how, arranged for the various possible things they might decide to do. This table looks like this.






P(T) =

P(T) = ½

P(D) =

P(D) = 0


P(T) = 0

P(T) = ⅓

P(D) = ½

P(D) = ⅓

In this circumstance Troilus and Diomedes’ diverging aims will direct them to push buttons X and A respectively as these choices, for each of them, strictly dominate their alternatives. With a different aim, however, they could have had the outcome Y/B, an outcome which would have been better for them both.

The question, then, is: does the bare possibility of this happening — bearing in mind that the possibility in question is what Gibbard calls a “wild contingency”, something that Troilus and Diomedes in the non-demon-haunted real world need hardly worry about — show that the rather sensible-looking recommendation of the modest conception represents “an incoherent way to arrange our lives”, does it show that any social contract, to even be intelligible, must demand of Troilus and Diomedes that they should cease seriously to compete for mates as all sensible mammals do and instead adopt some common goal scale that gives each of their respective romantic aspirations equal weight? Or is this rather a form of putative incoherence which, given the obvious good sense of what the modest conception of an ideal social contract here recommends, we can pretty happily live with? I’ll leave that question as an exercise for the reader.