Reconsidering Reparations

Reconsidering Reparations

Olúf́mi Táíwò, Reconsidering Reparations, Oxford University Press, 2022, 261pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197508893.

Reviewed by Darrel Moellendorf, Goethe University Frankfurt


Olúf́mi Táíwò’s book is rich enough in material and arguments that it will engage people with a variety of philosophical and political interests. It will be of particular interest to those engaged with the philosophical and political debates about reparations for colonialism and slavery. The book develops an account of these as historical injustices that cause morally salient inequalities between those who have benefited from the compound effects of the earlier injustices and those who have been disadvantaged. Táíwò’s argument that climate change policy should be seen, at least in part, in terms of the politics of reparations extends the debate about reparations in new and interesting ways. And for those primarily engaged with the justification of climate change policy and the politics of climate justice, the book’s claim that inequalities in climate vulnerability are the legacy of colonialism and racism provides an important historical perspective. The book argues that climate politics should consider the injustices of climate change as an instance of the legacies of colonialism and racism. The call of the book to bring the injustices of racism into the analysis of, and response to, the problem of climate change is particularly important for a warming world marked by colonial legacies. The overall political vision of the book is to push beyond the legacy of injustice created by colonialism and slavery to a new and more just world. The politics of doings so, according to Táíwò, is the politics of worldmaking.

My expertise is in climate justice, and so I will discuss the book primarily for its contribution to debates in that area. But, since that contribution involves the account of historical injustice and responsibility developed to justify reparations, some of the discussion of reparations can’t be left out of the assessment of the book’s importance for climate justice. Taking the limited approach I do here fails to do justice to much of the book’s interesting discussions, which draw on the history of colonialism, Black Marxism, and the reparations debate. I’m keenly aware of these limitations, and the reader should be as well.

Táíwò claims that “A politically serious reparations project—at least one fitting the goals and ethos of the constructive view—must focus on climate justice” (157). The argument for this depends on two claims. First, the promotion of social and global justice now can’t avoid the centrality of climate change. “the possibility of keeping justice alive in our time hinges on our response to the reality of a warming planet” (158). And second, an adequate response to climate change can be interpreted as part of the politics of reparations. “As climate impacts accelerate, we can expect them to perversely distribute the costs and burdens of climate change, disproportionately impacting those who have been rendered most vulnerable given the accumulated weight of history” (161).

A fundamental moral and political challenge for the politics of climate justice, as Táíwò sees it, is to respond to climate change in a manner that appropriately takes into consideration the skewed vulnerabilities produced by the unequal accumulation processes set in motion by colonialism and slavery.

we need to figure out how to address the ecological and the political disasters. The economic and political systems developed by global racial empire are responsible for the accumulations that explain the crisis: both the buildup of greenhouse gases in the atmosphere and the highly uneven buildup of advantages and disadvantages that determine how climate vulnerability is distributed within and between countries. (171–172)

As Táíwò and colleagues Anna Saez and Chun Hin Tsoi show by means of original empirical analysis, climate justice is part of the reparations project because the states that are especially vulnerable to climate change are formerly colonized ones, and those least vulnerable are former colonizers (215–222). A similar policy focus on vulnerability could be arrived at by arguing that vulnerability (or impoverishment, as I have argued) alone is sufficient to prioritize groups in climate policy. But that would obscure what Táíwò holds to be the key morally relevant fact fundamental to the reparations project, namely that vulnerability to climate change results from flows and accumulations over time that were set in motion by colonialism and slavery.

What does recognition of the colonial history add to the case for prioritizing the vulnerable? In trying to come to terms with the moral relevance of historical injustices, there are several challenges. An account that looks only backwards struggles to offer a compelling reason for why people in the present should be held accountable. But an account that is wholly focused on present inequalities takes history as explanatorily but not morally significant. Táíwò claims that history is relevant to the case for responsibility, or liability, which is the term he prefers. What is relevant “is the extent to which we are benefitted and the extent to which we are harmed” (144) by the legacies of colonialism and slavery.

He might be read as developing on an account of historical responsibility, except that Táíwò claims that “we don’t need the notion of responsibility” (122) in order to make the case for the moral relevance of colonialism and slavery. Responsibility, as he understands it, “is closely tied up with the web of related concepts like fault and cause” (122). As useful as these concepts can be, they “aren’t built to respond to things on the scale of global racial empire. While we can sometimes identify individual culpable parties for individual events or even eras of domination, we are often tracking the impacts of their actions across multiple generations in which complicated legacies often intersect” (122). A similar concern is a prominent in Iris Marion Young’s account of responsibility for structural injustice. Young rejects what she calls the liability model on similar grounds.

I believe that Táíwò and Young are right to note the limits of the assignment of individual moral responsibility based on fault and causation in cases of institutional and structural injustices. Whereas Young refers to such accounts as based on what she calls “the liability model,” Táíwò calls his alternative “liability.” He does so in order to align himself with the concept of strict liability in the law, which as he explains, “obligates people and corporations to bear the costs of injuries in ways that bypass blame and fault finding entirely” (123). He cites the classic case of Vincent vs. Lake Erie Transport in which a boat owner was held liable for damages done to a dock resulting from tying the boat to the dock during a storm. Although the boat owner did nothing that would typically be grounds to fault him, he was nonetheless held liable for the damages that the boat caused to the dock.

Táíwò does not work out the conditions required to hold someone liable as he understands it. Rather, as I have mentioned, he maintains that what is relevant is “the extent to which we are benefitted and the extent to which we are harmed” (144). Strict liability, however, generally tracks causation of harm rather than the benefit derived from it. In Vincent, the tying of the boat to the dock caused the damage; this is relevant regardless of fault. Táíwò’s view is that structures of accumulation that have arisen as a result of colonialism and slavery in turn cause the present inequalities that reparations seek to address. As he notes, “we are often tracking the impacts of their actions across multiple generations” (122). Those who subsequently benefitted under these structures of accumulation did not cause them. The causal work is in the differential processes of accumulation. Due to the role of the inheritance of benefits and harms on his view, it seems to me that an account of beneficiary responsibility would be well-suited to support Táíwò’s claims.

The idea of beneficiary responsibility is that to be responsible one need not have acted or failed to act, or have contravened a reasonable standard of care, or have known the consequences of one’s actions or omissions, or have caused the outcome, just to name a few grounds often associated with fault. Such an account of responsibility might allow climate justice to take on board the historical injustices of colonialism and slavery since the conditions just cited do not apply to people who were not alive at the time of these injustices. Additionally, beneficiary responsibility appeals not merely to the responsibility of the privileged as would, for example, an ability to pay or a capacity account of responsibility (a view that I have defended). Beneficiary responsibility has a different ground than simply privilege. It is that the privileges are causally, whether with or without knowledge, due to previous injustices.

Táíwò’s rejection of the use of the concept of responsibility is, I think, a rejection of a fault conception of responsibility, not responsibility more generally. Responsibility, as I see it, is the conceptual twin of justice. Whereas the latter is an account of the moral creditors, responsibility is an account of the moral debtors. This idea is vividly present in the language of “check” and “promissory note” that Martin Luther King used in his speech at the March on Washington in 1963. Corresponding to any account of what people are owed under justice is an account of who is responsible for paying that debt. Indeed, the latter might have nothing whatsoever to do with fault.

The moral relevance of colonialism and slavery to the skewed vulnerabilities to climate change is the basis for Táíwò’s discussion of the politics of climate justice. He suggests several targets and tactics for the politics of climate reparations. As he explains it, “‘Tactics’ are collective actions to join or start up that can meaningfully contribute to change at scale, things you can do right now. ‘Targets’ are places we should hope to get to, by means of these tactics and many others” (189). The change that can be sought, according to him, will be the result of compromise with elite interests, and hence will preserve at least some of the underlying structures of advantage transmission. As Táíwò sees it, “Political systems are most amenable to progressive change when the interests of the elites align with those negatively affected by the system” (173). The targets that he suggests then are presumably made with elite compromise in mind.

The first target is unconditional cash transfers (174). Táíwò seems to favor a proposal specific to the US in which African Americans descended from slaves in the US would receive disbursements over time (175). The justification for this is not hard to imagine on the basis of beneficiary responsibility, but the way in which it connects to mobilizing for climate justice is another matter. Perhaps elites might be willing to compromise on a program of cash transfers to African Americans, assuming that such elites were not terribly burdened in funding the program through a special tax on wealth or high incomes. But if they were not called upon for the bulk of the contributions, then presumably working people would be. The target in that case could be divisive to a climate movement in need of broad popular unity in order to take on the power of the fossil fuel industry. The target of cash transfers would seem to require choosing between the aim of elite compromise and building a broad popular movement to challenge the fossil fuel industry.

The second target is global climate funding (176). Táíwò rightly identifies the moral importance of wealthy countries paying into international funds such as the Green Climate Fund (177). This, he suggests, could be an easier alternative for wealthy countries to meet their climate change reduction targets—easier, that is, insofar as “it would be technologically difficult to make the needed scale of changes in a given country”. (178) Wealthy countries do, I believe, have an obligation to contribute much more significantly than they have to the Green Climate Fund, especially to fund climate change adaptation. I don’t doubt the rectitude of the demand. But again, with movement building in mind, it is important to highlight the massive gains of making a transition to an economy based on renewable energy, rather than the ease of off-shoring climate action. The co-benefits of doing away with burning and extracting fossil fuels are well known. Additionally, the economist Robert Pollin and his colleagues argue in Greening the Global Economy that a transition to renewable energy is a net job growth strategy. That suggests the possibility of building working class support for renewable energy, if the transition is accompanied by income and benefits support for workers in the extractive industries. In order to make climate action broadly popular, the benefits of the transition rather than the ease of contributing elsewhere should be highlighted.

Táíwò’s third target is to torch tax havens so that capitalists cannot hide their wealth. Being able to access the wealth by means of taxation would help to fund cash transfers and climate investments (179–180). The fourth target is community control in order to build and protect “the resources and stock of social advantages for Black, Indigenous, and other colonized peoples” (181).

One tactic that Táíwò suggests for the pursuit of the four targets just canvassed is to demand divestment from socially noxious institutions, practices, and companies such as racist policing and mass incarceration, and the fossil fuel industry, and to pursue green investments in Black and Indigenous communities (182). Another tactic is to build alliances of residents of affected communities, researchers, and lawyers through a cadre of citizen scientists. This would help “narrow the considerable gap in power between those fighting for environmental justice and the power structure aiming to deny it to them” (185). A final recommendation is both a tactic and a target, according to Táíwò. This is to develop new forms of deciding together over policy and approaches to protect the environment, including forms of participation that connect local groups across international borders (187–188). Also included under this rubric is the proposal of union-community alliances which are involved in “bargaining for the common good” (189).

This is a heterogeneous collection of targets and tactics. Táíwò seems to eschew a common strategic target and a best strategic path towards it. The four targets range from domestic policy reform to provide cash transfers to people disadvantaged by historical injustice, to participation in international funding efforts to help vulnerable states, to developing international regulation to abolish tax havens, to supporting greater local control over resources for historically oppressed groups. My sense is that the discussion of targets and tactics could be more tightly focused on the politics of mass movement, building on the assumption that such a movement is the relevant agent for challenging the power of the fossil fuel industry. But Táíwò might disagree with that assumption.

I have suggested some skepticism about the politics of elite compromise to the targets that Táíwò set out. This applies also to the aim of worldmaking. Worldmaking is the effort to build “a more just world on a global scale” (5). Táíwò suggests fundamental change is in order, for capitalism itself is the problem. “[I]f global racial empire is the what, then capitalism is the how” (23). The system that requires transformation is racial capitalism, which should be understood more broadly than merely race and capitalism as its relevant factors (30). The more radical the vision of worldmaking, the less, it seems to me, that the politics of achieving it will be based on compromise, and the more it will be based on confrontation.

Táíwò claims that worldmaking “involves thinking about justice and injustice in distributive terms: that is, as a matter of who gets what” (20). In explaining the idea that distributions are products of structures, and that the latter have histories, he uses the vivid metaphor of an aqueduct system. “We can look at the politico-economic system of the world as something like a water management system, a web of aqueducts that spans the globe, channeling, instead of water, advantages and disadvantages from one place to another. The system describes which way future waters will naturally run, and where they not run without novel intervention” (20). The metaphor captures a system that is global in its scope, “a set of inertias, gravities, pressures, and bottlenecks that bound and channel the endless flow of the present; material, money, media, violence, advantage, disadvantage” (21). Aqueducts are also historical artefacts. “The stones of the aqueducts that contain and discipline the continuous motion of the past into the future were laid in the seventeenth, eighteenth, and nineteenth century.” The flow of advantages and disadvantages has created a world, “the Global Racial Empire” (21).

Metaphors represent relations of similarity, not identity. Hence, even a good metaphor that reveals much may obscure important matters. A limitation of focusing the discussion of justice on “a set of inertias, gravities, pressures, and bottlenecks” in the distribution of goods is that our attention is directed away from the nature of productive relations and the system of ownership that enables that form of production. This, for Rawls, is the proper concern of justice, namely the basic structure. And for Marx this is where the distinct form of surplus labor is compelled that characterizes different forms of class society. The aqueduct metaphor risks encouraging a focus on the sluices turning on and off in order to control the flow of advantages, rather than the form of cooperation or exploitation that is the production and distribution of the water. There are other important questions of distributive justice in a political economy. Who should own the infrastructural capital itself, the aqueduct? How does such ownership affect how we produce? How does it affect how we decide to produce? These would seem to be matters of worldmaking not easily addressed by a focus on flows.

There is so much more to discuss in this book, which is remarkable in its effort to direct the politics of reparations to a focus on climate justice. The book’s contribution to the climate justice literature is deeply important. The colonial legacy of skewed vulnerabilities to climate change has been woefully under-discussed in the philosophical literature on climate justice. Táíwò's book forcefully puts the topic on the table in a way that will now be impossible to ignore.

Let me close by mentioning that I read this book with an informal and longstanding group of political philosophers and theorists, most of whom were graduate students and postdocs. We had some of the most interesting, and at times lively, discussions that we have had in recent memory. I trust that when read and discussed with others, the conversations that the book provokes will be interesting, lively, and productive.