Reconstructing Rawls: The Kantian Foundations of Justice as Fairness

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Robert Taylor, Reconstructing Rawls: The Kantian Foundations of Justice as Fairness, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2011, 336pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271037714.

Reviewed by Catherine Audard, London School of Economics


Rawls's claim in A Theory of Justice that his conception of justice as fairness could gain universal support has always been the object of doubts and criticisms. Is this a realistic political purpose or should it be seen simply in regulative terms? How can the two principles "seem to be a fair agreement on the basis of which those better endowed, or more fortunate in their social position . . . could expect the willing cooperation of others" (TJ 13) or how can "a unanimous agreement . . . be reached" (TJ 120) when the demands of justice are so obviously contrary to the interests of a large proportion of citizens?[1]

Rawls himself has answered these questions in his Political Liberalism, giving a strictly political justification that should be universally appealing given that it does not infringe on people's conceptions of the good; but his view has been interpreted by his critics as a form of moral relativism[2] and as tending to water down his ambitions in order to gain a wider support and to balance the demands of justice with those of 'stability' (PL xvii-xvii), a completely different empirical and political preoccupation. This has given support to the idea of a contradiction between the two books, a claim strongly rejected by Rawls himself, who states quite clearly that the two books answer different questions and that the content of the two principles of justice is left untouched by the shift from a comprehensive form of liberalism to a political one (PL 4-11). If his critics are right, then, the consequences go far beyond internal inconsistency. The whole Rawlsian promise to articulate a sound justificatory process for the liberal conception of justice, for the rule of law and for its defence of basic liberties and rights, will have failed. It will have been diluted in the hope of gaining a wider consensus and the limits of toleration will have been dangerously extended, leaving it morally weak and politically impotent in the fight against increasingly loud and aggressive forms of illiberalism.

The aim of this new and very controversial book by Robert Taylor, Reconstructing Rawls, is to offer a coherent criticism of the 'second' Rawls and to "reconstruct justice as fairness on Kantian foundations" (ix) against Rawls's own anti-foundationalist stance. It seeks to demonstrate the impossibility both of such a dilution of the theory of justice and of a wide consensus on its principles. The two-pronged strategy of the book is to reveal, in Parts I and II, the strongly Kantian roots of the conception of justice as fairness, demonstrating that it can only make sense on the basis of its Kantian conception of persons, and, in Part III, to conclude that "there can be no overlapping consensus on a Kantian conception of persons or justice as fairness more broadly" (276), contrary to Rawls's central claim in Political Liberalism; but this, it is contended, will leave it stronger, not weaker. Recognizing its Kantian foundations will, in fact, strengthen the conception of justice as fairness and make it

a worthy companion to other cosmopolitan Enlightenment liberalisms -- for example, Millian plural-perfectionism, Benthamite or Sidgwickian liberal utilitarianism, and Lockean religious liberalism -- in the fight against illiberal principles and institutions around the globe (xxiii).

This may strike any reader or scholar of Rawls's work as a remarkably challenging assumption, in view of how much time and effort Rawls has put into saying the opposite. The hope is that this book will start a wide ranging discussion of the merits and weaknesses of such a Kantian reconstruction, a reconstruction which is not fully developed in the book, the Conclusion being obviously too rushed to be fully convincing. Still, this very personal and deep book makes a definitely strong claim that cannot simply be dismissed, pointing, as it does, toward at least two major difficulties that need to be elucidated.

There is first the question of how strong a Rawlsian version of liberalism is in the fight against illiberalism today. Is it worth sacrificing the appeal of liberalism as a universal moral ideal for the sake of consensus? How far should the toleration of illiberal views and practices extend? Secondly, how convincing is an egalitarian version of liberalism in the fight against libertarian views of liberalism? Taylor addresses both problems with rigour and decisiveness and his conclusions should be taken seriously. He claims that a reconstruction of the argument in strictly Kantian terms is not only possible, but also convincing. To summarize, such a reconstruction will lead to

some unorthodox conclusions about justice as fairness, to be sure: for example, it yields a more civic-humanist reading of the priority of political liberty, a more Marxist reading of the priority of fair equality of opportunity, and a more ascetic or antimaterialistic reading of the difference principle. (ix)

In Part I, Taylor gives a presentation of Rawls's 'Kantian period'[3] that aims to differ from a long series of commentators in that it reveals an intimate relationship to Kant that Rawls himself seems somehow to have ignored. Taylor shows how Rawls avoids both moral relativism and moral realism in grounding his moral view on practical reason in the Kantian sense. Against moral realism, Rawls claims, as Kant did, that objective moral truths are not "fixed by a moral order that is prior to and antecedent of our conception of the person and the social role of morality", but are "constructions of reason" ("Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory", quoted on 8), that is, of inter-subjective agreements that hold across individuals and groups who confront the same moral problems. This follows necessarily from Kant's central claim, against moral realism, that the human subject has an autonomous will (Wille) which issues imperatives or objective principles that may govern our actions. In that sense, we can see ourselves as free, that is, as both the author and the subject of the moral law. However, against moral relativism, moral truths, in spite of being 'constructed', avoid arbitrariness because, as the Kantian conception of persons assumes, they are produced by agents who (1) act on the basis of practical reason, not on that of desires or impulses, and (2) understand moral imperatives to be universally binding for all rational beings on a basis of equality and reciprocity. "Our capacity to choose maxims freely according to self-authored objective principles is emblematic of our rationality" (14) or practical reason. As Kant says, it is sufficient to show that categorical moral imperatives are possible (non-contradictory) to defeat moral relativism.

This is the Kantian path followed by Rawls in his 'constructivist' conception of justice as fairness which transforms the intractable question of justice into a rational choice situation. It is usual to summarize Rawls's method as constructivist by saying that its conception of justice is 'procedural', not substantive. If the procedure followed to 'construct' or choose principles of justice is itself just and fair, its results will be just or fair and gain general agreement. It starts with the general axioms of rational choice and assumes that if the choosers ('parties') are supposed to be rational (as having a 'thin theory of the good') and are situated in an initial position of ignorance and impartiality, treating each other as free and equal, their choice will be just or fair. However, Taylor offers a different and original interpretation that puts the emphasis on the substantive role played by the Kantian conception of the person, whereas, for Rawls, the conditions in the original position should suffice to embody the moral demands of justice without any need for an external substantive moral doctrine. This is a highly contentious point and it is not clear that the diagram presented in Part I is a satisfactory rendering of Rawls's constructivism. It claims that the Kantian conception of the person is a necessary 'input' in a procedure of construction, the outcome (or 'output') of which determines the content of the first principles of justice. This would lead to re-introducing substantive moral truths in a process that is taken to be independent of given moral beliefs and which derives its moral force from its mere conditions -- the formal constraints of the right, the information structure and the axioms of rational choice. As we will see, this highly contentious tripartiteinterpretation is central for the whole thesis advanced in the book.

In Part II, the most satisfactory part of the book, the author revisits, in the light of the role played by the Kantian conception of persons, all the main arguments used by Rawls for his defence of the two principles of justice and their priority rules, and points to a number of inconsistencies and weaknesses that have so far evaded most commentators. He examines in great detail the arguments for the priority of political liberties, civil liberties, a fair equality of opportunity and the difference principle.

Two points are particularly enriching. The defence of the priority of fair equality of opportunity by Rawls is certainly, as the author claims, "one of the most puzzling lacunae in all his work. . . . he fails to offer any justification for this priority rule" (175). Reconstructing this defence leads to focussing attention on one frequently overlooked aspect of Rawls's thinking, that "self-realization trumps mere consumption" (177), which has crucial consequences for his critique of the Welfare State and of a social minimum based on basic needs. This commitment to self-realization stems directly from Rawls's support for Kantian autonomy and leads to giving the fight against social dependency priority over the fight against natural dependency and to the difference principle. Such a modest perfectionism still remains compatible with justice as fairness and has important policy implications, which are skilfully suggested by the author in his book and other papers.

Another convincing reconstruction offers a radically Kantian autonomy-based defence of the difference principle that shows that it is definitely superior to its rival, the principle of restricted utility. The only satisfactory defence of the priority of the difference principle originates in Rawls's Kantian conception of "persons as ends in themselves" which leads "to forgo those gains which do not contribute to everyone's expectations" (TJ 157, quoted on 221). Even if such an argument is too extreme in its asceticism and cannot reasonably be expected to gain approval from non-Kantians, from citizens only interested in an instrumental justification of redistribution, it is the only way of making sense of the moral demands implied in the veil of ignorance, which "deprives parties in [the original position] of any information that would enable them to make a heteronomous choice" (227), that is, a choice that would not treat them and others as ends in themselves, but simply as means. As a consequence, the author claims, a very specific Kantian conception of the person is necessary to make sense of Rawls's arguments in favour of the priority of the right and justice over expediency, utility or human excellence, even if this very conception limits its appeal as a public conception of justice.

Taylor has emphasized in Part II how radically egalitarian and anti-materialistic Rawls's view is.  The second phase of his strategy, in Part III, is intended to stress how difficult it is "to see how most democratic citizens could reflectively endorse either it or the principles of justice that flow from it -- short of a 'radical shift' in their belief systems of a kind that Rawls has effectively ruled out" (240). In other words, without their foundations being clearly stated as Kantian, the principles of justice cannot be properly defended. But as soon as they own to their Kantian foundations, they must abandon their claim to universal acceptance. Having demonstrated that Rawls's 'true' programme is in reality even more egalitarian and universalistic than he himself first thought -- that is, Kantian in the broad sense  -- Taylor concludes that it is too narrow to gain general acceptance. The "inconvenient truth" (275) that Rawls discovered after the publication of A Theory of Justice is that a consensus on such radical principles is highly unlikely. The strategy adopted by Rawls in his 'political turn', according to Taylor, consists in distancing justice as fairness from its Kantian foundations and in diluting its moral force.

As Taylor explains,

Rawls believes that the political-constructivist module [the Kantian conception of persons] is invariant across reasonable comprehensive doctrines, that is, he believes . . . [it] can be supported not just by a Kantian comprehensive doctrine, but by a whole series of non-Kantian comprehensive doctrines as well. In other words, we can liberalize the justificatory framework . . . without watering down the content of the principles being justified. (275)

This claim is strongly rejected as both impossible and disastrous, and the last Part of the book aims to demonstrate "the poverty of political liberalism" (297). It denunciates Rawls's "fateful decision" to ground his principles of justice in "democratic culture, not practical reason" (54) and to turn to "a constructivist-cum-relativist method" (55). This is where the reader might part ways with the book.

First, it misinterprets Rawls's rejection of foundationalism: no comprehensive doctrine can serve as a foundation for a public conception of justice since, if it is public, it cannot be derived from any particular set of values. Its only foundation lies in the free agreement of citizens; otherwise it would be an illiberal conception of justice, incapable of giving recognition and expression to their autonomy. It is worth stressing that Rawls has always claimed that even if Kantian elements are present in the 'considered convictions' of citizens and in the public culture of liberal democracies, they are not the foundation of his theory. His starting point is not a Kantian conception of persons, but citizens' beliefs and political conceptions of justice.

Secondly, the book underestimates the very value of a constructivist method which dispenses with any need for foundations. Rawls specifically says that the original choice situation 'represents' our nature as free and equal beings as reasonable and rational, never that this description of persons could serve as a foundation for the principles of justice. He explicitly says the opposite in A Theory of Justice:

the principles of justice are not derived from the [Kantian] notion of respect for persons, from a recognition of their inherent worth and dignity . . . It is precisely these ideas that call for interpretation . . . The theory of justice provides a rendering of these ideas but we cannot start out from them. (TJ 513)

Commentators such as Ronald Dworkin or Charles Larmore[4] have questioned this claim and have tried to explain that Rawls's theory of justice needs a deeper conception of human persons. His answer to these comments has always been consistent: the procedure itself, being autonomous and manifesting persons' moral and personal autonomy, serves as its demonstration and does not need foundations. It was the failure of A Theory of Justice in its third Part to convey this idea that led him to his 'political turn'. More importantly, any derivation of the principles other than from our 'considered convictions' as citizens of a late twentieth-century liberal democracy would contradict the very respect which is due to autonomous citizens as free and equal persons, as lawgivers capable of choosing and recognizing as binding their public conception of justice. Respect for autonomy is certainly the main feature of Rawls's liberal conception of justice and, as a consequence, it demands that no single comprehensive philosophical or moral doctrine, Kantian or other, should be advanced as its foundation.

Thirdly, it dismisses the very possibility of the unity of Rawls's project, a possibility argued for by many commentators.[5] In order to 'reconstruct' his 'road not taken', that is, to "turn justice as fairness into an authentically comprehensive and universalistic liberalism, thereby fulfilling the implicit promise of Theory" (xxiii), the book rejects Rawls's later work. It assumes from the onset that Rawls becomes guilty of ethical relativism after his 'political' turn of the mid-1980s and that, having sacrificed the Kantian defence of his first principles in the name of stability and consensus, he is therefore no longer able to provide a solid foundation for his theory (xxii-xxiii, 239). Because political liberalism is a watered-down version of justice as fairness, it "provides little moral guidance in answering . . . vitally important questions" (292) such as "moral reasons to oppose the proposed expansions in the scope of toleration" of illiberal regimes, institutions and policies domestically or internationally.

As an original contribution to a theory of justice, inspired and motivated by Rawls but mostly by a different Kantian and universalistic agenda, this is an extremely valuable and stimulating book that should be assessed on its own merits, once its claims are reformulated in less confrontational ways. But as a reconstruction of Rawls's own project, the book fails in part because the views expressed by Rawls in his Political Liberalism are not given an entirely fair hearing. More worryingly, it misses the central idea of justice as fairness, that no independent and antecedent criteria of justice should be imposed on citizens' conceptions of the good in a democratic context, as this will always involve recourse to coercion.

[1] All pages references are to the revised edition of A Theory of Justice (Harvard: Harvard University Press, 1999)

[2] See, for a similar interpretation of the 'second' Rawls, Richard Rorty, 'The priority of democracy over philosophy' in Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.

[3] These include TJ §40, but also the Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy and the Dewey Lectures.

[4] "Respect is a value on which that theory rests. Respect for persons plays two roles in his conception of justice. It shapes the two principles themselves with their emphasis on the inviolability of the individual -- the role which Dworkin was concerned to lay bare. It also figures in the demand that persons be treated in ways that they can see to be justified. That is the role of respect underlying the ideal of publicity" (Charles Larmore, in The Cambridge Companion to John Rawls, S.Freeman (ed.), Cambridge University Press, 2003: 374-375).

[5] The argument in favour of the unity of Rawls's project is central in my John Rawls, London, Acumen Press, 2007.