Reconstructing Reality: Models, Mathematics, and Simulations

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Margaret Morrison, Reconstructing Reality: Models, Mathematics, and Simulations, Oxford University Press, 2015, 334pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199380275.

Reviewed by Claus Beisbart, Universität Bern


Suppose you want to learn about a range of phenomena that are complex and not well understood. One strategy is to design a model of the system in which the phenomena occur. You devise a stand-in of your original target system, analyze it and then transfer insights from the stand-in to the target (cf. Weisberg 2007). This method has often been successfully applied in the sciences and sometimes even led to a new theory. Since it seems puzzling how one can study a system by scrutinizing something else, modeling has become the focus of much work in the philosophy of science.

Margaret Morrison's new book offers another philosophical look at modeling. Her main goal is to explain how models can help reconstruct reality, i.e., advance our knowledge and understanding of the world (p. 1). Interestingly, she does not approach her field in the spirit of a modeler, nor does she aim at developing a general theory of modeling. Her view is rather that we do not need philosophical theories of modeling or representation to better understand modeling. Her method is best characterized as taking detailed observations from case studies, elucidating them from a philosophical perspective and discussing philosophical claims that have been put forward about models in light of the examples. So how much does this approach advance our understanding of modeling?

The first part of the monograph deals with explanation, understanding and mathematics. Chapter 1 aims at showing how mathematical abstractions can contribute to our understanding. By abstractions Morrison means assumptions that do not apply to the target of a model and that cannot be relaxed if this target is to be understood. For instance, in statistical physics, phase transitions, e.g., the melting of ice, can only be derived from the microphysical laws if the thermodynamic limit is taken, i.e., if it is incorrectly assumed that the number of particles is infinite, or so Morrison argues. For further examples of abstractions, she discusses mathematical models from population genetics.

But what exactly is the role of mathematics in abstract models? Is it only a handsome language that allows us to cast physical assumptions in simple terms and to infer the consequences more easily? Some authors have gone much further than this and claimed that mathematics provides a substantial part of some physical explanations. Morrison takes a similar view when she argues that pure mathematics can contribute to our understanding of natural systems (Chapter 2). Her example is the use of the renormalization group in statistical physics. According to Morrison, the group yields a technique with which we can explain central aspects of critical behavior, e.g., the emergence of long-range correlations from short-range interactions. In particular, renormalization group methods can constrain the values of critical exponents that apply to large classes of physical systems, the details of which differ greatly. For Morrison, this so-called universal behavior cannot be understood by using standard statistical mechanics only.

The second part of the book turns to the question of how models relate to the world. Due to their unrealistic assumptions, models are sometimes called fictions. In Chapter 3, Morrison criticizes the view that all models are fictions. One objection is that this view can explain truth within the model but not how a model can tell us something about the real world. Morrison's own view is that only some models are fictions. Maxwell's vortex ether model, from which he derived the field-equations of electro-magnetism, is an example. One reason is that Maxwell had some liberty in constructing his model, in the same way that poets are not much constrained when they invent their fictions. Abstractions, by contrast, prove necessary to obtain some phenomenon. Morrison suggests that fictional models represent in virtue of some similarities with their respective targets, but since the analogies are often less than obvious, the representational power of fictional models needs to be carefully pinpointed on a case-by-case basis.

Chapter 4 focuses on the relationship between models that represent a real-world system and theories. Morrison takes up her well-known view that models can function as mediators between theory and the real world. This function can be realized in two ways: Either the process of modeling starts with a system and later draws on theory, or, alternatively, the modeler begins with theory and constructs a model to which the theory applies. In either case, the model is said to represent; it either represents a real system or what is going on in theory. Nancy Cartwright thinks that there is a class of models that are necessary if we want to apply a theory to the real world but that yield very poor representations of reality. These models are called interpretive. For Cartwright, an interpretive model was most important for the development of the BCS theory of superconductivity. Morrison argues against Cartwright that the construction of the theory was initiated by a model that was supposed to represent the real target system and that specified the causal mechanism responsible for superconductivity, i.e. the pairing of electrons due to interactions with the lattice. Morrison stresses that this model was not ad hoc but rather well-grounded in previous insights about superconductivity.

Sometimes, the same type of system is modeled using a variety of different models, each of which is fairly successful. The question then is how we may explain the successes of the models. We cannot say that the assumptions of all the models are true when these assumptions are inconsistent. One answer is perspectival realism, according to which various incompatible models can each be true relative to different theoretical backgrounds. Chapter 5 criticizes this view by comparing two areas, each of which is shaped by a plurality of very different models. In the dynamics of turbulent flows, the situation is not as worrisome as it might look like since all models share the same fundamental assumptions and really complement each other because they are designed for different applications. Morrison argues that an appeal to perspectival realism is unnecessary in this case since this view is already implicit in the practices of modeling. Things are different in nuclear physics, where about 30 models are really inconsistent because they fundamentally disagree about the structure of the atomic nucleus and the effective interactions. Morrison claims that perspectival realism degenerates into instrumentalism if it is applied to this field. So it does not fare well in either case.

Many models are nowadays studied using computer simulations, which form the topic of the last part of the book. Chapter 6 argues that computer simulations can generate experimental knowledge. This is supposed to mean that the results of some computer simulations have the same epistemological status as results from experiments and that they are no less reliable. Morrison also thinks that a distinction between the two methods is sometimes very difficult to draw. The reason why she assimilates some computer simulations to experiments is that simulation scientists in some way work on their target system, e.g., galaxy clusters, because, using the simulation, they work on a model that serves as a stand-in for the target system. Experimentalists likewise need models to extract information from the system they work on, as Morrison demonstrates by discussing measurements. Her argument thus is that some computer simulations and experiments measure physical characteristics in the same model-based way. She admits, though, that computer simulations cannot establish new phenomena.

But, of course, results of computer simulations only qualify as knowledge if a strong case can be made for them. Working scientists use so-called methods of verification and validation to provide evidence in favor of the results of their simulations. Chapter 7 explores these methods, which have so far largely been neglected by philosophers. While verification is meant to show that a computer simulation correctly solves the equations of a model, validation assesses a simulation in relation to data. Morrison favors a clear separation of verification and validation and thus distances herself from a conflicting claim by Eric Winsberg. She further stresses the importance of so-called validation experiments that are specifically designed to test certain aspects of a computer simulation. Overall, on her view, the practices of verification and validation are less ad hoc and in better shape than Winsberg claims, although she admits subjective elements that have an impact on the assessment of simulations.

Validation of computer simulations becomes more difficult if the experiments to which simulation outputs are compared rely themselves upon computer simulations. This is so in high energy physics, as a case study about the recent discovery of the Higgs particle shows in Chapter 8. For Morrison, the results about the particle depend logically on simulation since the analysis of the data is based upon simulation. There is further a causal dependence because the detectors were designed using other simulations. We are thus faced with an integration of experiment and simulation. Although validation becomes more difficult in high energy physics, Morrison does not take a skeptical attitude towards the Higgs results. One reason is that test runs of the experimental apparatus provide data that allow for a test of the simulations that is independent of the final results of the Higgs search.

As this overview shows, Morrison covers a lot of interesting materials from physics. The book does not constitute one big argument, nor does it center on a few philosophical claims. But the chapters and their results are multiply connected with each other, and Morrison's intention seems to be that, in this way, some understanding of modeling in contemporary physics arises.

Of course, those people who think that modeling should be understood using general philosophical theories of representation will be disappointed. Morrison makes it clear from the outset that she does nto believe in philosophical theories of modeling and representation, and it is not the aim of this book to refute the theories that have been proposed. Her book thus is best assessed as trying to take an alternative route that may perhaps be called particularist. So how well does this approach fare?

If understanding of how modeling works is simply to know more about instances of modeling, then Morrison does a lot. But is this enough? As a matter of fact, Morrison's treatment of some examples leaves us with puzzles: how can it be that we understand phase transitions in the real world only using models that essentially rely on wrong assumptions? how can pure mathematics give us information about the physical world? Morrison exposes what physicists are doing and why, but readers will have a hard time pinpointing the insight that is supposed to answer the questions. This observation somehow matches Morrison's remark that she is only interested in how mathematics provides understanding, not why (p. 4). But what exactly is the difference between how and why and how can one understand the how without the why here?

Now Morrison does go beyond the mere description of examples where she discusses philosophical theses. Some of her own claims are fairly narrow in scope because they arise as critical reactions to more sweeping claims from the philosophical literature and because they are elaborated using specialized case studies. They are nevertheless interesting and deserve more attention.

When examining Morrison's claims, one has to be careful, though, because some of them oscillate between different meanings. At places, her views are formulated in a way that makes them appear far-reaching or even extravagant, while elsewhere Morrison seems to get at something significantly weaker. For instance, in Chapter 6, she suggests that she "establish[es] the experimental nature of simulation" (p. 229). This sounds as if she made the rather controversial claim that simulation is a type of experiment. But Morrison is only referring to some types of computer simulations, and what she really shows is that results of simulations and experiments are sometimes epistemically on par because we may trust them to the same extent. This is a different claim and not so controversial any more. Or consider Chapter 2, where she claims: "stripped of any physical adornment, mathematical techniques/frameworks are capable of generating physical information in and of themselves" (p. 51). This is an extravagant claim. But elsewhere she summarizes her point by saying that, in some cases, "understanding . . . is not achievable using physical theory alone" (p. 80).

Some of Morrison's claims, e.g., about the BCS theory, are plausible, but sometimes, her philosophical argument for her claims lacks rigor. Consider again Morrison's claim about mathematics in its more radical version. To defend it by using the example of the renormalization group, she would have to show that the application of the method in statistical physics does not imply any physical assumptions. But there is no such argument. In fact, no such argument can be given, e.g., because the values of the critical exponents that are illuminated using the renormalization group depend on the number of relevant spatial dimensions, which is a physical characteristic. To take another example, Morrison's argument against perspectival realism is extremely short. At least for me, the few lines that are supposed to show that this position collapses into instrumentalism in nuclear physics do not suffice to make this case (p. 188). Or recall Morrison's view that we can only understand phase transitions by taking the thermodynamic limit and thus assuming an abstraction, viz. an infinity of molecules. Morrison is right that if we define a phase transition by a discontinuity, as is often done, then phase transitions can only be derived in the thermodynamic limit. But there is a real question of whether, e.g., the melting of ice in the real world is a phase transition in this strong sense. The answer seems no if our block of ice isn't composed of infinitely many molecules. Further, if we show that there is a discontinuity in the limit of an infinite number of particles, we really show that a certain curve is as close to being discontinuous as we want, provided the number of particles is sufficiently high. And the question then is whether something close to a discontinuity doesn't suffice for the melting of our real block of ice. If it does suffice, we do not need an abstraction to understand the phenomenon of a melting ice block.

Another reason we may feel that the book does not advance our understanding of modeling too much is that the examples themselves are difficult to understand. It would have been helpful if Morrison had taken more care to introduce the examples and analyzed them more thoroughly. The reader is sometimes faced with many details the relevance of which is unclear (e.g., the lists of models on pp. 174-6 and p. 183). Some technical terms are used before they are properly explained (e.g., correlation length; p. 79). Further, some details are even misleading (e.g., the equation on p. 36 or talk of a beta function on p. 72).

Overall, Morrison's look at concrete and intricate cases of modeling raises a number of interesting issues, and at places, her piecemeal approach is as refreshing as her claims are thought-provoking. The book thus is a valuable reading for philosophers who work on modeling in physics. Morrison's particularist approach does advance our understanding of modeling, but at least for me, it does not run too deep. For those who disagree with Morrison's approach, it should, at any rate, define a challenge to further deepen our understanding of modeling.


I thank Margie Morrison for very useful hints.


Weisberg, M. 2007, "Who is a Modeler?" British Journal for Philosophy of Science 58(2):207-233