Reconstructing Schopenhauer's Ethics: Hope, Compassion, and Animal Welfare

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Sandra Shapshay, Reconstructing Schopenhauer's Ethics: Hope, Compassion, and Animal Welfare, Oxford University Press, 2019, 230pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190906801.

Reviewed by Sophia Vasalou, University of Birmingham


Among the many philosophers who might claim our interest and finite energies, why read Schopenhauer? Taken generally, it is a type of question that often haunts those with a scholarly stake in philosophers who represent outliers in mainstream views of the subject. In the case of Schopenhauer, it has sometimes taken its edge from a sense of ambivalence about how well his intellectual practice fits into contemporary ideas of how philosophy should be conducted. Among many readers, admiration for the audacity and grandeur of the edifice of his philosophy as a whole has mingled with an uneasy sense that the philosophical arguments that hold it up are not the most compelling -- perhaps unsurprising coming from a thinker who believed philosophy was in the business not of compelling through argument, but of giving reflective articulation to feeling. In this context, it has been especially difficult to determine how to negotiate those features of Schopenhauer's understanding that form the chief basis of his reputation. This includes, above all, his trenchantly proclaimed pessimism, summed up in the statement that, pace Leibniz's shallow optimism, ours "is the worst of all possible worlds" (WWR 2:583), whose "non-existence would be preferable to its existence" (WWR 2:576).[1] The aim of our own existence, by extension, is nothing more than "the knowledge that it would be better for us not to exist" (WWR 2:605). Yet as Nietzsche pointed out, even if the edifice erected by a philosopher is ultimately pulled down, "the bricks with which he built" can still "possess value as material."[2] Several of the most prominent engagements with Schopenhauer's philosophy in recent decades have shared in this spirit. Against a background assumption that the value of reading Schopenhauer stands in need of justification, they explore ways of unpicking the whole, isolating the most serviceable elements, and reconstructing these for philosophical use.

Sandra Shapshay's book can be located in this context. It offers a reconstruction of one important strand of Schopenhauer's overall project, his ethical theory, particularly as spelled out in his 1840 essay On the Basis of Morality. Careful consideration of Schopenhauer's ethics, Shapshay argues, reveals a conception that has "relevance for normative ethical theory" (p. 16) and is "valuable for contemporary ethical reflection" (p. 207). She designates this conception as "compassionate moral realism." According to this view, human beings have inherent value that calls for a certain kind of moral treatment; and the way we know this value is via the feeling of compassion. Insofar as it tracks a real feature, compassion thus has a crucial epistemic function. This truth-tracking function in turn secures the normativity of the feeling of compassion. The theory that emerges, Shapshay suggests, represents a hybrid of Kantian ethics and the sentimentalism associated with Hutcheson, Smith, and Hume. While Schopenhauer rejects Kant's conception of absolute human dignity -- for him it is not rational nature that is criterial, but sentience or "having a world," and so inherent value is not confined to human beings but includes all sentient beings -- it shows him to have retained far more of Kant's ethics than commonly acknowledged. In expanding the community of morally considerable beings to include all beings that, qua sentient, "can care -- in some measure -- about their lives" (p. 190), Schopenhauer offers an ethical theory that is less anthropocentric than Kant's and that can accommodate a concern for animal welfare, while having greater built-in flexibility in approaching value as a matter of degree.

Laying hold of this positive ethical viewpoint, however, requires first working through some obstacles. This includes, above all, the small obstacle posed by Schopenhauer's professed pessimism. From this perspective, the most appropriate response to a true understanding of the nature of the world -- a blind will that purposelessly strives, as manifestations of which we are fated to suffer -- is resignation from the will-to-life. Shapshay proposes to challenge this prevailing picture of Schopenhauer's thought. Her starting point is that there are two sides to Schopenhauer that need to be accounted for. While there is indeed the dark Schopenhauer and counsel of resignation whom she calls the "Knight of Despair," we find a different Schopenhauer in the "somewhat hopeful ethics of compassion" (p. 2) whom she terms the "Knight with Hope." The extent of the conflict between these two sides and their corresponding ethical ideals, Shapshay argues, has gone unappreciated by most commentators. Having foregrounded this conflict, which poses a "fundamental consistency problem" for Schopenhauer's thought (p. 2), she argues that there are good reasons for preferring the latter Schopenhauer over the former.

What are those grounds? They are of two kinds, philosophical and interpretive. On the one hand, Shapshay takes this hopeful account to be "a more defensible philosophical theory as such" (p. 3), one which she openly acknowledges she finds "more appealing philosophically" (p. 7) than the standard reading. On the other, she thinks there are interpretive considerations that should lead us to prefer it: it is "an interpretation of Schopenhauer's ethical thought that is what the thinker actually did say at least some of the time" (p. 3), and "good grounds for hope" are to be found from within Schopenhauer's "own system" (p. 5, emphasis added). Roughly half of the book (chapters 2 and 3) is dedicated to offering interpretive re-evaluations of three aspects of Schopenhauer's account which she sees as the main stumbling blocks to this alternative view.

One concerns the role of the Platonic Ideas in Schopenhauer's system. Timeless and changeless "grades" of the will's objectification, the Platonic Ideas, in Shapshay's view, inject a strong element of stasis in Schopenhauer's understanding, lending themselves to a fundamentally ahistorical view of reality that forecloses belief (and hope) in the possibility of progress. Yet Schopenhauer's commitment to the Ideas, Shapshay suggests, did not survive
his acquaintance with proto-Darwinian evolutionary theory, and the Ideas conspicuously take the back seat in his later work. With the Ideas out of the picture, it becomes possible to hold that human nature can change over time; it also becomes possible to hold that individual human beings can change, instead of being locked into the "intelligible character" that constitutes them as special Ideas.

Having relieved Schopenhauer's account from one piece of metaphysical baggage, Shapshay proceeds to relieve it of another, by returning to the vexed question of the status of Schopenhauer's metaphysical claim that the "thing-in-itself" is will. Here, too, Shapshay suggests Schopenhauer's views underwent development. Once we see this as a hermeneutic rather than a transcendent claim, established through a coherentist rather than foundationalist methodology, the basis of Schopenhauer's pessimism -- which comes together when the factual proposition that there is enormous suffering in the world is wedded to the modal proposition that suffering is essential to life and cannot be significantly reduced -- comes apart. And with this, the road to hope again stands wide open.

In a third move (the focus of chapter 3), Shapshay takes up the hairy question of Schopenhauer's apparent determinism, which she views as a more specific reason why Schopenhauer's credentials as an ethical theorist have suffered neglect. Without a belief that human beings can "act other than they do, it makes little sense to hold that they ought to act differently" and thus "to offer a normative ethical theory" (p. 98). Re-examining the textual evidence, Shapshay argues that Schopenhauer does not in fact endorse hard determinism but rather embraces "a Kantian-style compatibilism interwoven with varying degrees of mysterianism" (p. 100), in the sense that the freedom of the will -- as expressed, paradigmatically, in the experience of the sublime or the denial of the will-to-life -- is ultimately declared a "mystery." With these obstacles cleared, she offers her positive reconstruction of Schopenhauer's "compassionate moral realism" in chapter 4, followed by a short chapter that explores the role of reason in Schopenhauer's ethics and argues for the need to expand this role in a reconstructed version of Schopenhauerian ethics.

Given that several of the interpretive issues discussed in chapters 2 and 3 have been treated by other commentators on not entirely dissimilar terms, one waits somewhat impatiently for the reconstructive heart of the book which unfolds over the last two chapters. While this interpretive infrastructure has an important role to play in Shapshay's main argument, it is hard not to feel that the space devoted to it has come at the expense of an opportunity to develop the more interesting, original, and indeed provocative part of her project more fully. To anyone who comes to the book with a conventional understanding of Schopenhauer's philosophy, the idea that Schopenhauer, the transcendental idealist who professed that life has no value, endorses a form of moral realism that involves ascribing inherent value to sentient beings will seem startling on first blush and in need of robust defence.

The main defence, as far as I can see (developed over pp. 175-84), rests on three pieces of textual evidence and one philosophical argument. The textual evidence seems to me far from ironclad. The philosophical argument (p. 180) is more suggestive. Compassion, according to Schopenhauer, motivates a person to prevent or relieve the suffering of another. Yet why, Shapshay asks, "would a perception of another and oneself as worthless motivate someone to positive action?" The point, as I read it, is that action undertaken with a view to preventing or relieving another's suffering presupposes (is only conceivable as the expression of) a belief in the inherent worth of that other. It is suggestive, but in my view it would have needed far more development in order to serve as the fulcrum of an argument in favour of Schopenhauerian compassionate moral realism. To note the most obvious problem, it is unclear that this argument isolates a type of value that would allow Shapshay to draw the boundaries of the moral community where she proposes, including only and all sentient beings. I regularly water my small army of house plants, and if prompted I would say it is to prevent them from suffering.

From an interpretive perspective, it is especially difficult to see how the evidence considered in this part of the book -- making the case, crucially, for the inherent value of sentient beings as individuals, who as such can feature as the objects of compassionate action -- could shrug off, without explicit argument at any rate, the weight of Schopenhauer's pervasive assertions concerning the worthlessness of the individual. Nature "never lies," as he puts it in one place; her "statement is that the life or death of the individuals is of absolutely no consequence" and has "no significance at all [gar nichts zu bedeuten habe]" (WWR 2:473). This applies not only to non-human animals, but also to human beings, whose life is "a matter of indifference [gleichgültig]" (WWR 2:474). Individuality is an "error," "something that it would be better should not be" (WWR 2:491-92). This view finds its context in Schopenhauer's transcendental idealism, which takes multiplicity to be relative to our knowledge as governed by the principle of sufficient reason. From this perspective, if anything has "value" or "significance" (and it is not definite that the two terms are co-extensive), it is the imperishable metaphysical reality manifested in these plural phenomena, whether this is taken as the will or the Ideas that form the grades of its objectification (as the passages cited by Shapshay on pp. 181 and 182 suggest).

Both of these, of course, form part of the metaphysical baggage that Shapshay suggests we can profitably drop from Schopenhauer's scheme. Part of the argument here is interpretive, and rests on Shapshay's developmental reading of Schopenhauer's work, according to which Schopenhauer himself was the first to drop much of this baggage. I am sceptical about some of these revisions -- certainly of a revision that would involve stripping Schopenhauer of his static view of history and denigrating attitude to the particular (indicatively, compare the passage cited by Shapshay on p. 87, WWR 1:183, with the later PP 2:276).[3] To the extent that some of these subtractions admit debate, this points to a different type of question shadowing her project, which concerns, to revert to Nietzsche's metaphor, the value of the bricks qua material once prised free from the environing structure.

It is not simply that much has to be dropped to extract a normative ethical theory from Schopenhauer's work. It is also that much has to be added, given the numerous gaps and weaknesses that Shapshay herself calls attention to. This applies not only to Schopenhauer's account of human freedom, where she notes Schopenhauer's "troubling" (p. 134) silence on important issues and the "significant lacuna" (p. 136) that besets his account, but also, more relevantly, to his view of compassion as a criterion of right action, which she dissects and finds wanting in chapter 4, arguing that compassion is neither necessary nor sufficient. Another point of weakness, as already signalled, concerns the role of reason, for which Schopenhauer makes inadequate room. Shapshay expresses confidence that Schopenhauer "would agree" that rational reflection is required to determine right action in many cases (p. 206), and thus consent to amend his account. For my part, I am less sure, given the importance of the philosophical commitment involved. Yet what is clear is that this would mark the removal of yet another supporting wall from the overall edifice.

The moral intuition we prise free, if Shapshay is right -- that sentient beings have inherent value -- is an important one, and will clearly appeal to all those with a prior sense of the significance of that intuition and its broader implications, for example for animal rights. Yet given the amount of repair work and reconstruction required to make Schopenhauer's ethics serviceable, it is hard not to wonder what is the added value of taking that intuition from Schopenhauer specifically, particularly once we have removed all those other unwelcome accretions that gave his edifice its distinctive character. To my mind, this is not a question that Shapshay quite helps us answer; this might have required taking more concrete steps to bring Schopenhauer into the forum of contemporary moral theory. In the absence of a definite answer, to some this might seem less like reconstruction than apologetics.

Part of the issue here is whether Schopenhauer wants to be doing ethics with us at all. In a discreet footnote (p. 99 n. 4), Shapshay brings up what many readers will view as possibly the most important challenge to her project. Schopenhauer himself consistently disavowed the idea that he, or anyone, could sensibly do ethics in the prescriptive mode. In On the Basis of Morality, he made clear that he was not doing ethics in the conventional sense, advancing views about "how people ought to behave"; for him the purpose of ethics was to "explain and trace to its ultimate ground" human behaviour "from a moral point of view" (OBM 130) -- to explain the phenomena (OBM 140).[4] This is linked not only to his view of the powerlessness of concepts to influence human character (WWR 1:271) but also to his view about the incoherence of the "imperative form" of ethics (OBM 130). This would explain why his ethical theory fares so poorly when we try to approach it as a source of normative guidance, notably by taking his descriptive account of the basis of moral worth as a decision procedure for identifying right action. Without this normative dimension, the point Shapshay leverages as a central motivation for her project -- the apparent conflict between compassion and resignation taken as normative ideals -- also washes away.[5] This is not to deny that Schopenhauer himself, as Shapshay aptly observes, expresses strong normative views on a range of issues in his own voice, for example when discussing the treatment of animals or slaves in his day. Is the expression of moral praise or blame fully consistent with disciplined adherence to an explanatory viewpoint? This could take some interesting argument.

It is easy to sympathise with the aspiration to find new ways of articulating the significance of philosophers who draw our admiration through the power and grandeur of their intellectual constructs. Can we make away with the bricks once the construct gives, and build new? The jury is still out, but the enduring power of Schopenhauer's philosophy will ensure we keep trying.

[1] WWR=The World as Will and Representation, 2 vols., trans. E. F. J. Payne (New York: Dover Publications, 1966).

[2] Friedrich Nietzsche, Human, All Too Human, trans. R. J. Hollingdale (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), II/I §201.

[3] PP=Parerga and Paralipomena, 2 vols., trans. E. F. J. Payne (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1974).

[4] OBM=On the Basis of Morality, trans. E. F. J. Payne (Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett Publishing, 1995).

[5] As it also does for other reasons, above all that Schopenhauer provides a clear ranking principle.