Recovering Integrity: Moral Thought in American Pragmatism

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Stuart Rosenbaum, Recovering Integrity: Moral Thought in American Pragmatism, Lexington Books, 2015, 169pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498510202.

Reviewed by G. Scott Davis, University of Richmond


Stuart Rosenbaum sets out to complete Alasdair MacIntyre's project of demolishing contemporary Anglo-American moral theory, concluding that, pace MacIntyre, we need neither Nietzsche nor Aristotle, but rather William James and John Dewey. For Rosenbaum, the European entry into the western hemisphere demanded the recognition of competing ways of life that could not be swept away. While the book as a whole is uneven, I think Rosenbaum makes a powerful case for a distinctively pragmatic moral perspective that provides a natural fit for the sort of pluralist, democratic, social world many of us associate with America at her best. That he neglects the potential for moral thought in "America's greatest Pragmatist" simply leaves room for that to be developed by others.

Ethics, for Rosenbaum, should begin with the question "Who am I?" But it is essential to recognize that "the question is not simply for individuals; it is also for communities of all kinds." (ix) Rosenbaum asks us to consider an example from Jared Diamond, who tells the story of Daniel Handa, a New Guinea highlander "who, because of his family relationships, acquired the moral responsibility to avenge the death of his Uncle (sic) Soll who was killed in battle with the Ombal clan." (9)[1] Here, responsibility is a function of family, clan, and the traditional institution of vengeance. The relations among these identifying notions are passed down to Daniel as part of the process of growing up. Carrying out vengeance is expected and failure to do so would diminish Daniel in his own eyes and in the eyes of his community; "his moral integrity required that he exact vengeance for the crime against his family." (10) Other concerns -- personal risk, the perpetuation of a destructive institution, the fact that the object of his vengeance is not the actual killer of uncle Soll, but another man -- are subordinate to making good on his responsibilities. Furthermore, it would have been irrelevant to invoke some general or abstract moral theory for the simple reason that that's not who the Handa are. Being the sorts of persons they are meant to be, living the sorts of lives they are meant to live, is what matters.

Rosenbaum thinks that stories such as Daniel's pose a problem for moral theory, at least of the modern analytic sort, because the "autonomy of philosophical inquiry from the worlds of fact and science, captured in the idea that it is pure conceptual inquiry, segregates Western philosophy not only from science, but also from literature and history." (18) From Hobbes to Kant, the goal of moral theory has been to identify the essence of human nature and then to develop the central concepts in order to articulate the moral law. He argues that "pure conceptual inquiry" is part of a Platonic legacy, reaffirmed by the Enlightenment, that is forever engaged in the Procrustean project of cutting reality down to fit an ideal that exists only in the minds of an isolated intellectual caste.

"Pragmatism," in the tradition of James and Dewey, "turns Platonism on its head: good action or good practice precedes theory." (29) While our European ancestors brought with them an

implicit conception of themselves as Platonists . . . the American context into which the colonists had transplanted themselves was the scene of a variety of thriving native cultures that had different understandings of who humans were and what their role was in the ecological spaces they inhabited. (29-30)

The self-assured stance of the Platonist was not possible in America, if only because the early settlers were challenged by the alternative ways of living of the indigenous peoples. It is no accident, Rosenbaum might have pointed out, that the first distinctively American novelist made his reputation following Natty Bumppo from life among the Delawares and the Mohicans out to the western prairie, commenting all the while on the comparative virtues and vices of European expansion.

Who we should be becomes, in the American context, as much a matter of inquiry as any question in the natural sciences. As an account of inquiry, Pragmatism challenges a priori assumptions about what must be with the demand that we look to see what actually is and how it hangs together. When we do, suggests Rosenbaum, we find Dewey's "natural piety" to be "an inherent constituent of a just perspective in life." (33) Those people to whom we are inclined to attribute integrity and practical wisdom acknowledge that who they are and what they have achieved depends on the contributions of those who came before them. Personal growth involves both continuity and innovation informed by the modesty of fallible creatures in an ever changing natural and social world. There are, as Dewey insists,

no fixities that ought to control moral living . . . A future of integrity is a future lived in faithfulness to one's constituting communities, in faithfulness to one's own and one's community's ideals and in creative independence of those communities' standards and expectations. (38)

We must begin with the norms and ideals with which we were brought up, but the distinctively pragmatist orientation to those ideals is one that treats them as the product of human beings negotiating a life in the world with each other. At any moment the actual way of life at which we have arrived is subject to criticism and revision. Consensus is always fluid and dependent on good faith reflection on how we should move forward.

Rosenbaum's embrace of fallibility and revision leads him, in chapter three, to address the charge of relativism; "does pragmatism's expansive commitment to respecting the many and various normative particularities that divide communities across time and geography," he asks, "mean that pragmatism is . . . following the trajectory of Plato's critique, incoherent and untenable?" (47) The answer, not surprisingly, is "no," but his strategy for getting there, grounded in James's discussion of truth, strikes me as the weakest part of the book. "Our account of truth," Rosenbaum quotes from James, "is an account of truths in the plural, of processes of leading, realized in rebus, and having only this quality in common, that they pay." (49) The difficulties of this move are well known, and Paul Boghossian's critique follows along expected lines. (50-53) Rosenbaum's response, that "pragmatists do not believe that knowledge is true, justified belief," (53) simply plays into Boghossian's hands.

The pity is that it isn't necessary. Rather than following James and Dewey, Pragmatists have the option of taking Peirce as their model for inquiry. Peirce maintains a common sense notion of truth while waving off "theories" of truth with talk about the end of inquiry, adopting a position that would later come to be associated with the later thought of Donald Davidson.[2] From this perspective, knowledge can remain justified true belief, with justification carrying the traditional pragmatic qualities of fallibility and revisability. This does give up certainty, but that's not much of a loss. Thus deflated, Boghossian's worries about relativism turn into nothing more than the inescapable fact of human disagreement, not only in ethics, but in the sciences as well.

Rosenbaum hints at this strategy when he writes that, "knowledge exists as a product of inquiry, as a result of the myriad techniques of knowing as a human practice." (55) But instead of following up on it, chapters four through six sketch an account of integrity that is, I think, compromised by his anti-realist account of truth and belief. The section "Belief Pragmatist Style," starts off recalling Peirce, for whom, "belief is a habit of action. Understood as a habit of action, and including the other ideas that go with the idea of habit -- disposition, tendency and inclination, as well as others -- belief becomes thoroughly amenable to scientific and genealogical account." (73) From this unexceptionable account, however, Rosenbaum moves to the claim that, "each belief is thoroughly an expression of individual uniqueness, each belief of any individual is psychologically different from the belief of any other individual." (74) If, by this, he wants to maintain that how each individual arrives at a particular belief will be different, then it is hard not to agree. But Rosenbaum seems to go beyond this in rejecting the relevance of what we might call the "content" of an individual belief. "Representational confidence," he remarks, "is an idea that could emerge only from an Enlightenment-derived understanding of belief, for according to that understanding beliefs represent realities, propositions that exist and are true or false." (80) But this is what we should reject.

Instead, "finding out where beliefs come from is the scientific, explanatory, and genealogical task that pragmatist thought about belief brings to the fore." (81-82) When confronted with difference of belief, the pragmatist identifies "an occasion for seeking understanding. The integrity in a pragmatist understanding of belief is partly seeing individuals as wholes, as characters having developed to their present state and in process of developing toward a hoped for better state." (83-84) Personal integrity, which he takes up in chapter five, is a matter of commitment to growth into successful members of the "human moral world." (90) Success and failure in this project reflects the judgment of the particular moral communities with which individuals identify. "More admirable as well as more defective exemplars differ for different individuals and communities," writes Rosenbaum, inviting us to consider, "Marilyn Monroe, Marilyn Manson, Charles Manson, John Wayne, John Wayne Gacey [sic], Brittney Spears [sic], Lena Horne, Louis Armstrong, Leonard Bernstein, Hoagie  [sic]Carmichael, Brooks Robinson, David Ortiz and others too numerous to mention." (ibid.) This is a remarkable list, brilliant not least for the unstated bridge between Carmichael and Robinson, namely the former's "Baltimore Oriole." But what are we to do with it? Rosenbaum may be on solid ground when he rejects "the idea that morality must be universal and impartial," as a "remnant of the Enlightenment need to secure moral value and human worth rationally against the results of science." (91) And he is making an important point insisting that, "a working theory of morality needs greater relevance to the human world and greater respect for moral realities." (92) It is important to know that "small children in Gaza City are systematically schooled toward becoming suicide bombers," and that because they are denied access to viable social and moral alternatives, when they "reach maturity, they want nothing more than to find a way to serve Allah by sacrificing their own lives." (105) But devaluing traditional moral judgment as the self-congratulatory upshot of Enlightenment imperialism doesn't leave much leverage for critical debate.

This isn't helped by the turn to the environment in chapter six. Dewey's "natural piety" ends up being further relativized to local interpretations of "interaction, pluralism, community and growth." (114) These issues find some measure of resolution in Rosenbaum's final chapter, "Integrity and Reality," however, Taking his cue from James's radical empiricism, Rosenbaum returns to "Developments in twentieth century science and philosophy" which "have unsettled our faith in the Enlightenment project." (139) The physics of Einstein and of Heisenberg has called into question the prospects for a comprehensive and unified theory of everything. The work of Thomas Kuhn has put the practice of science in a more human perspective, bringing the pursuit of truth, if we still want to call it that, closer to the more expressive human practices of literature and the arts. Physicists such as David Bohm, Leonid Mlodinow, and Stephen Hawking have developed "a view about the nature of science that accords fully . . . with that of James and Dewey." (150) Rosenbaum takes this to signal the imminent success of the pragmatic project for reintegrating the human with the natural world, thus securing our integrity both as social and as natural beings.

Recovering this integrity, it would seem, facilitates living the reflective life, but it is unclear what help it provides us in dealing with life's "attendant moral, social, environmental and scientific/metaphysical responsibilities." (153) And here's where it might have been interesting to incorporate the thought of the figure Peirce called "America's greatest Pragmatist:" Josiah Royce.[3] Royce's place in the Pragmatist Pantheon remains contested, despite his close embrace of Peirce from The World and the Individual (1901) on. It is fairly clear that the gradual eclipse of "the absolute" by the "great community" in Royce's later work is shaped, if not inspired, by Peirce's early essays. This is not the place to advocate either for Royce's inclusion in the Pragmatist Pantheon. I bring him up to point out a lacuna, not only in Rosenbaum's moral thought, but in that of James, Dewey, and Rorty as well. None of these undoubted pragmatists seems to me to provide either an explication of or a motivation for embracing distinctively American, pluralist, democracy. Royce, in The Philosophy of Loyalty (1908), not only identifies the importance of such provincial loyalties as his to California, but the importance of such provincial identifications in training for loyalty. Democratic loyalty grounded in the communal give and take of local deliberations creates a standard of political discourse that can be recognized across regional differences. Such a standard encourages mutual acknowledgment. But the outcome of political discourse still depends, in complex ways, on an old-fashioned, pre-Enlightenment, commitment to truth. Royce's discussion of James, truth and ethics in the penultimate chapter of The Philosophy of Loyalty is a model of engaged pragmatism.

But Rosenbaum misses the boat by what I earlier called his anti-realist commitment to the more extreme of James's and Dewey's pronouncements on truth. He seems to recognize the importance of accounting for how different communities engage each other in his remarks about our indigenous predecessors (29-30), but he doesn't develop the point. Instead, he seems to take as sufficient Dewey's remark that, "we now have to re-create by deliberate and determined endeavor the kind of democracy which in its origin one hundred and fifty years ago was largely the product of a fortunate combination of men and circumstances." (13-14) The artificial attempt to re-create an ideal smacks of the medieval enthusiasms of Sir Walter Scott, whom Mark Twain famously made responsible for the Civil War. Pragmatic cosmopolitanism, on the other hand, doesn't motivate loyalty, and this remains a problem for pragmatic moral thought. Rosenbaum is, I think, correct in his assessment of contemporary moral philosophy as a form of scholasticism, more interested in an Enlightenment ideal of what philosophy should be than in the ways that real communities develop, understand themselves, and negotiate at least partial solutions with which they can live. He is right, as well, that there is an alternative inchoate in American Pragmatism. He has, however, left it to others to develop the subtleties of that alternative.

[1] Rosenbaum is a bit sloppy here. Diamond identifies his subject as Daniel Wemp, a member of the Handa clan. The original does not capitalized "Uncle." Diamond's original appeared not in the April 28, but in the April 21, 2008 issue of the New Yorker. In fact, his cultural and political references display a cavalier attitude to documentation that is a little disheartening. For instance, on p. 32 he confuses Dylan Thomas with W. B. Yeats. More disturbing, on p. 92 he describes "the 1994 genocide in Rwanda" as "perpetrated by Tutsis against Hutus." While there is plenty of blame to go around in the Rwandan civil war, this is just backwards.

[2] I have argued this position in detail in Believing and Acting: The Pragmatic Turn in Comparative Religion and Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2012.

[3] Peirce makes this remark in a letter of 1903. See Joseph Brent, Charles Sanders Peirce: A Life, Indiana University Press, 1993, p. 293.