Recreative Minds: Imagination in Philosophy and Psychology

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Currie, Gregory and Ravenscroft, Ian, Recreative Minds: Imagination in Philosophy and Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2003, 248pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0198238096.

Reviewed by Peter Carruthers , University of Maryland


Recreative Minds is an insightful and wide-ranging discussion of the nature of imagination and its role in human cognition. Topics covered include the distinctions amongst different kinds of imagining (for example, between belief-like imaginings and perception-like imaginings), the mechanisms underlying visual and motor imagery, the role of imagination in mind-reading (that is, in mental-state attribution), the nature and developmental significance of childhood pretence, our emotional responses to literature and theatre, and explanations of autism and schizophrenia as (distinct) kinds of disorder of the imagination. Currie and Ravenscroft write clearly and engagingly throughout, and their careful dissection of many of the issues and arguments that they consider is quite masterful. The book deserves to be widely read by both philosophers and psychologists interested in any of the above topics. I shall say just a little about the main focus of each of the book’s chapters, before zeroing in on, and briefly developing, three lines of criticism.

Following a short introduction, Chapter 1 distinguishes amongst a number of different phenomena that commonly go under the name of ’imagination’, and identifies and marks out one of them that is to be the authors’ main target, which they call ’recreative imagination’. The states of mind involved in episodes of recreative imagination are states that are significantly like states of belief, desire, or perception, but they lack the full causal roles of beliefs, desires, and perceptions. Chapter 2 then investigates the nature of recreative imagination somewhat further, and shows how imagery, fantasy, and supposition are all forms of this sort of imagination.

Chapter 3 takes up the simulation / theory debate about the nature of our mind-reading abilities. It defends a modest version of the simulation approach, showing how this implicates the imagination and distinguishing it from the more extreme views of some other simulationists (notably Robert Gordon). Chapter 4 examines what is known, and what can plausibly be inferred, about the mechanisms underpinning imagery, particularly visual and motor forms of imagery. Then Chapter 5 argues that there are important differences between propositional kinds of imagination and perceptual kinds.

Chapter 6 looks at the development of imagination in childhood and at its relationships with pretence. Chapter 7 argues that autism is best understood as involving a deficit of imaginative capacity. Chapter 8 discusses recent explanations of schizophrenia and argues that it, too, is best understood as a (different) kind of disorder of the imagination. (Schizophrenia is said to result from a failure to introspectively monitor one’s own acts of imagination properly, as opposed to a failure of imagination per se, as is the case in autism.) And then finally, Chapter 9 discusses our emotional responses to literature and the performing arts, paying special attention to our emotional response to tragedy.

While the book’s treatment of the simulation / theory debate (in Chapter 3, and then again in Chapters 5, 6 and 7) is in many respects admirable, there is one regard in which the authors make life far too easy for themselves. For they characterize theory-theorists about our mind-reading capacities as claiming that such capacities involve nothing but theory. Not surprisingly, they are able to show that such a view is highly implausible, and they therefore declare that simulationism is the victor in the debate. But I know of no-one who calls himself a ’theory-theorist’ who believes any such thing. (I certainly don’t; nor do Shaun Nichols and Stephen Stich.) In recent debates, the real locus of conflict between theory-theory and simulationism has come to concern the character and origins of our mental-state concepts, like belief and attention, as well as the sources of our capacity to make basic inferential moves amongst mental-state types, so that, for example, one will go from, ’X is perceptually attending to a situation in which it is the case that P’, to, ’X (probably) believes that P’. Theory-theorists now accept (convinced by the arguments of simulationists like Alvin Goldman and Jane Heal) that mind-reading often involves the re-deployment of our regular reasoning and decision-making capacities, and hence is partly constituted by a form of simulation of the minds of other people. But they continue to insist that our core knowledge of the nature of the mind is theory-like, and arises in development either through a process of theorizing, or through the maturation of a domain-specific and innately structured ’module’, or by some combination of both.

Now, as it happens, Currie and Ravenscroft explicitly and openly concede that some of our central mentalizing concepts — especially the concept false belief — can’t plausibly be thought to emerge in development through processes of simulation. And in their descriptions of how simulation actually operates, they take mental-state concepts as a given. But they say nothing about the nature of such concepts, nor about where they and their core inferential liaisons are supposed to come from. So if the only viable alternative to simulationism is some form of theory-theory, this looks like it gives the main victory in the current debate to the latter, after all.

Let me move on to another line of criticism. At various points in the book, the authors commit themselves to the existence of desire-like as well as belief-like imaginings. Just as there are states that are belief-like, but which aren’t beliefs (such as the state of supposing that the banana is a telephone), so (the authors claim) there are states that are desire-like, but which aren’t desires. These would be states that stand to the state of wanting to call grandma on the telephone, in something like the way that the state of supposing that the banana is a telephone stands to the state of believing that the banana is a telephone — they wouldn’t actually be desires (e.g. a desire to call grandma), but they would have causal roles significantly like those of desires. Notice that the claim here isn’t that we can, in imagination, suppose ourselves to want to call grandma on the telephone. For this would be a belief-like supposition which happens to have, as part of its content, that I possess a particular sort of desire. This isn’t what is in question. Rather, the idea is that we can engage in a kind of supposing that is relevantly desire-like with the content that I call grandma on the telephone.

The main difficulty for this sort of view is that we cannot, in our imaginings, adopt contrary-to-desire suppositional desire-like states at will, in the way that we can adopt contrary-to-belief suppositional belief-like states at will. It is easy for us to adopt alien beliefs while imagining. (Consider how easy it is for us to become immersed in a work of science fiction, in which people can totally transform their bodily size and shape as they wish — e.g. turning into an insect — or can have the strength to move a planet, or can travel faster than the speed of light.) But it is by no means equally easy for us to adopt alien desires and values in imagination. It is hard for us to identify with a character in a novel whose main desire is to kill and cook little children. And novelists will have to devote considerable effort and skill if they are to induce us to take a story seriously that requires the adoption of an alien moral system as one of its central background assumptions. Currie and Ravenscroft acknowledge these points, but make no real attempt to explain them.

Now, as is quite familiar, imagination can certainly evoke real emotions — imagined insults can make you angry; imagined danger can make you afraid; the death of a character in a novel or film can make you sad; and so forth. So why shouldn’t we also accept that imagination can evoke real desires? And indeed, imagined delicacies can make you hungry (wanting food), as imagined sex can make you sexy (wanting sexual relief). Our account can then be that suppositions (belief-like imaginings) aren’t just taken as input by a suite of inferential mechanisms that would otherwise be employed in generating new beliefs from old, or in practical reasoning, as Currie and Ravenscroft claim, but that they are also taken as input by a variety of desire-generating and emotion-creating mechanisms. Hence we can claim that the desire-like states that occur in imagination are actually real desires, produced by the normal operations of such mechanisms in response to suppositional input. And this is the only way in which such states can be generated — passively, in response to belief-like and perception-like imaginings.

But how can they be real desires if they don’t lead to real actions? (Although frightened by the film, I don’t run out from the theatre; and although saddened by a character’s death, I don’t go into mourning.) The answer to this is easy. It is that real desires will only lead to real actions when interacting with real beliefs. We are allowing that suppositions and belief-like imaginings aren’t real beliefs. They differ from real beliefs in crucial aspects of their functional roles. For example, the deduced consequences of suppositions are themselves merely suppositions, and aren’t stored in memory and reactivated in the manner of beliefs; and practical reasonings that may take place within the scope of belief-like imaginings don’t normally give rise to actions, nor directly to intentions to act. So it is easy to allow that the desire-like states that occur during episodes of imagining are genuine desires, while explaining why they don’t have all of the usual functional consequences of desires. This is because those desires aren’t, during the episode of imagining, interacting with real beliefs. (Notice, however, that once you finish fantasizing about the meal that you propose to order during your next visit to Paris — in the course of which you haven’t really tried to call a waiter, of course — the real hunger that you have generated may send you heading to the kitchen for a snack.)

Why should there be this sort of difference between beliefs and desires in respect of their suppositional counterparts? Arguably, the explanation derives from the role of supposition in the mental rehearsal of action, and in reflective practical reasoning more generally. Once an initial plan has been hit upon – ’I’ll do Q’ – mental rehearsal consists of running the supposition that I do Q back as input through the various inferential systems (including desire-generating and emotion-generating systems), to see what other effects can be created or predicted. These in turn generate motivational and emotional responses, which can be monitored and summed to determine whether or not Q would be a good thing to do all things considered. (See Antonio Damasio, Descartes’ Error, for arguments and evidence that soma-sensory monitoring has a crucial role to play in normal human practical reasoning.) If we suppose that mental rehearsal is what the human suppositional capacity was originally for, in evolutionary terms, then it is easy to understand why the inputs to supposition-based processes should all of them derive from the factive (belief-like or perception-like) side of the mind. For it is by supposing that I do something, or by imagining myself doing something, that such rehearsals get started.

This sort of account can readily explain why it is so difficult for us to adopt alien desires or values in imagination. This is because there isn’t any desiderative equivalent of supposing, or because there is no such thing as desire-like imagining. What a novelist or playwright has to do, in order to evoke in us a motivational response that we wouldn’t normally have, is to manipulate our belief-like imaginings in such a way that a response of that kind might naturally be created. And I suspect that what an author has to do in order to bring us to full imaginative acceptance of an alien moral system, is to encourage us to imaginatively take on a rich network of normative beliefs (’It is good for the weak to suffer’, ’The strong ought to express their dominance over the weak’, or whatever), and then to rely on the fact that such attitudes are designed to straddle the belief / desire divide in order to produce in us at least some echo of the corresponding motivations and emotions.

This kind of account also has the resources to explain why it is that children engage in episodes of pretence, I believe. Consider how this might go in a particular case. The child sees a banana, and the overall similarity of shape between it and a telephone handset prompts the child to entertain the belief-like supposition, ’The banana is a telephone’, or more simply, ’That is a telephone’. Supposing that the banana is a telephone, and recalling that grandma can be called on the telephone, might activate the child’s standing-state desire to call and talk to grandma. Then by acting-out doing so (and by representing her movements as acts of dialing, of talking to grandma, and so on) the child can gain some of the motivational rewards of a real phone-call. For within the scope of the initial supposition, the child’s real desire to talk to grandma is satisfied, or at least quasi-satisfied. (No real talking with grandma actually takes place, of course, so the desire isn’t objectively satisfied. Nor does the child actually believe that she is talking with grandma. Rather, she represents what she is doing as talking to grandma, and her motivational system responds accordingly.) Of course, the satisfaction only lasts as long as the pretence continues; as soon as it finishes, the child is no longer thinking that she has recently spoken with grandma, and her desire to talk with her either reverts to dormancy, or remains active and unsatisfied. And indeed, it is common for children in such cases, when finishing a game of this sort, to say, ’Now let’s really call grandma’.

This account of the motivations behind pretence utilizes mental rehearsal mechanisms that we already have some reason to believe in anyway; and it explains why pretence tends to consist of activities that children find genuinely desirable. For notice that when children act out scripts – e.g. bathing the baby, talking with an imaginary friend, and so on – these tend to involve roles in which those children actually want to engage. But what about pretending to be a steam-train, for example? Surely the explanation for this behavior can’t be that the child actually wants to be a steam-train? In fact our explanation can be as follows, remaining within the spirit of our approach: the child finds steam-trains admirable (he really does); by acting out the movements of a steam-train, and hence by representing himself as a steam-train, the child is then representing himself as something admirable, and that is why he does it; for within the scope of his pretence, he can find himself admirable (which is enjoyable).

These considerations lead quite naturally into my third line of criticism of Currie and Ravenscroft’s book, which concerns their account of autism. On their view, autism is basically a failure of the imaginative systems of the mind, manifested most centrally in the failures of autistic children to engage in pretend play. This contrasts with the ’orthodox’ account of autism, which sees it as a condition resulting from damage to, or from failure to develop, core mind-reading abilities. (The latter is the now-familiar ’autism as mind-blindness’ hypothesis defended by Simon Baron-Cohen.) On Currie and Ravenscroft’s account, the reason why autistic children have difficulty in attributing mental states to other people, derives from the role that imagination normally plays in enabling us to simulate the minds of others, rather than from lack of core mind-reading ability. (So those difficulties don’t result primarily from problems involved in the children’s possession of mental concepts per se, nor from their lack of knowledge of core inferential liaisons.) For, by lacking imagination, autistic people will lack simulative abilities too.

The main alleged virtue of this account is that it explains the absence of pretence amongst children with autism. (Absence of pretend play is, along with lack of proto-declarative pointing and shared-attention behaviors, one of the three main diagnostic criteria for autism in very young — eighteen month old — children.) In contrast, it is said to be obscure why a lack of core mind-reading abilities should be associated with an absence of pretence. But given the points already made above, such an explanation can actually come quite readily to hand. For it is widely accepted that younger autistic children have significant problems with the recognition of agency, and in categorizing the actions of agents as such. (Autistic children have a marked tendency to treat other people as objects, using them as items of furniture, or as tools to achieve desired ends — e.g. pushing a care-giver’s hand in the direction of a desired object.)

So we can propose that the central deficit in autism lies within core mind-reading ability, initially affecting the child’s developing conception of agency and intentional action. (A number of developmental psychologists have proposed that the earliest form of mind-reading involves a simple kind of action-psychology, categorizing actions by the goals to which they are directed.) This then makes it difficult for the child to represent his own movements as the performance of another sort of action (e.g. to represent the act of holding a banana to his ear as an act of lifting a telephone), necessary to reap the motivational rewards of pretence. So the reason why autistic children don’t pretend, on this account, isn’t because they can’t, but because they don’t enjoy it. And indeed, there is significant evidence that autistic children can pretend when prompted. They just don’t normally see the point of doing so. (Admittedly, they also tend not to be very good at pretending when they do engage in it, but this is only to be expected if they don’t do it very often. Perhaps pretence improves only with practice.)

There are two basic kinds of book review. There are reviews that tell you in considerable detail what the book is about, and what the book’s contributions are to issues of current debate; and there are reviews that are mostly critical, attempting to push along and develop some of those debates still further. The present review has been firmly in the latter camp. But I wouldn’t want this to disguise my admiration for Recreative Minds, nor to give the reader the impression that I think the book isn’t a good one. On the contrary, Currie and Ravenscroft have written an excellent and wide-ranging discussion of the character and role of the imagination: read it and profit.