Redeeming the Prince: The Meaning of Machiavelli's Masterpiece

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Maurizio Viroli, Redeeming the Prince: The Meaning of Machiavelli's Masterpiece, Princeton University Press, 2014, 189pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691160016.

Reviewed by Cary J. Nederman, Texas A&M University


2013 marked the 500th anniversary of the composition of Machiavelli's The Prince. Not surprisingly, the past eighteen months have seen a plethora of conferences and publications celebrating this event. Among the latter is Redeeming the Prince, by Maurizio Viroli, one of the most prominent expositors of Machiavelli during the past three decades. Viroli's prolific scholarly output includes biographical, contextual and theoretical studies of Machiavelli.

In this volume, Viroli takes aim at one of the most perplexing features of The Prince, namely, the meaning of its 26th and final chapter, entitled "Exhortation to seize Italy and restore and free her from the barbarians." Why has this section been especially resistant to understanding and explication? Much of the problem lies with an overt and pronounced change in tone and language that distinguishes Chapter 26 from the preceding text. Indeed, scholars have occasionally been so disturbed by the shift in style that they have doubted whether the last chapter could have been composed of a piece with the rest of The Prince. Some have regarded it as an expression of Machiavelli's patriotism. Still others have been led to pronounce it simply a "ruse" or an elaborate "joke."

It is true that Chapter 26 may come as something of a surprise after the icy and even "shocking" tone of the preceding chapters. Machiavelli opens it with the question of whether the political program articulated in the first twenty-five chapters is plausible and practicable. Are the times propitious for the unification of Italy? Who might be capable of performing such a task? Looking back to the litany of great men who succeeded in establishing new states (specifically, Moses, Cyrus and Theseus), Machiavelli observes that the qualities (which he summarizes by term virtù) necessary for such grand feats are most often displayed in desperate circumstances. And Italy, he notes, is in precisely such straits: more enslaved than the Jews in Egypt, more oppressed than the Persians under the Medes, more disunited than the Athenians. But these are no mere coincidences. Instead, Machiavelli invokes God's plan in preparing the times for the arrival of a new prince, who is heralded in quasi-religious terms as a "redeemer" who will assuage Italy's woes. In light of Machiavelli's reputation as immoral and irreligious, such language introduces a hitherto underappreciated dimension of analysis: the divine hand is seen to be at work. This position has been advocated only recently, albeit from divergent perspectives, by a few scholars, such as Sebastian de Grazia, Miguel Vatter and myself, as well as by Viroli in a previous book entitled Machiavelli's God. In response to the second question, Machiavelli is normally thought to identify the house of the Medici, the ruling family of Florence since 1512, and especially Lorenzo de' Medici (to whom The Prince is dedicated) as the divinely chosen agent of Italian unification. (It should be noted, however, that nowhere in Chapter 26 does Machiavelli actually mention Lorenzo or the Medici family by name.) Machiavelli offers a stirring and impassioned plea for the emergence of "redeemer" of Italy. He evidently envisions Lorenzo as just the man to accomplish this redemption and thereby to gain limitless love from a populace sick of foreign invasion and ready to rally around him and his house.

In contrast to most scholars, for whom Chapter 26 cannot be reconciled with the previous body of the text, Viroli insists that Machiavelli's "Exhortation" represents the very crescendo of The Prince. How does Viroli arrive at such an unconventional reading? After introducing his initial statement of his thesis -- "that Niccolò Machiavelli wrote The Prince to design and invoke a redeemer of Italy capable of creating, with God's help, new and good political order, thereby attaining perennial glory" (p. 3) -- he engages in an extended critique of a range of alternative interpretations of The Prince as a whole in relation to Chapter 26. Viroli convincingly demolishes these positions on a combination of textual and historical grounds. Viroli then presents his own position. His overarching insight, I take it, is that we ought to take Machiavelli at his word when he speaks of religious matters and, in particular, mentions the workings of God. The prevailing tendency, of course, has been to dismiss such references as reflective of either his impiety or his wicked sense of humor. On this important point, I believe Viroli to be largely correct. Scholars have all-too-often filtered their readings of Machiavelli through a set of preconceived notions or impressions of what they assume he was saying, according to his longstanding reputation, rather than what the text actually states. This does not mean that Machiavelli's political thought lacks an underlying agenda, but rather that we must always commence our investigations by taking the words he wrote seriously and at face value.

Viroli's interpretation usefully links Chapter 6 of The Prince with Chapter 26. In Chapter 6, Machiavelli distinguishes between "unarmed" and "armed" prophets. The former group, excoriated by Machiavelli, is represented by Girolamo Savonarola, the Dominican friar who briefly led Florence's republic before his execution in 1498. By contrast, "armed" prophets -- those who have successfully acquired and maintained their power -- include such figures as Cyrus, Theseus, and (especially) Moses, who recognized their opportunity to act decisively and who possessed the skill to do so. In all cases, such opportunity involved the ability of a strong leader to unite and direct a people whose condition had previously been weakened. As Viroli emphasizes, this is the very theme that animates Machiavelli's "Exhortation" in Chapter 26: the dissolute circumstances of a "nation" (meant in the broadest sense) whose people are prepared to run great risks in order to expel foreign rulers and their troops, but who lack the requisite leadership to achieve this goal. Machiavelli's exemplars of successful rulership in Chapter 6 return in Chapter 26, with the further identification of their deeds with those of the future conqueror of Italy (if only he would grasp the opportunity). According to Viroli, "Machiavelli wrote The Prince for a new Moses" (p. 53), that is, someone who possessed the sort of virtù demanded for the unification and revival of a dissipated Italy.

A central element of Viroli's case for his reading of the unity and coherence of The Prince involves a reconstruction of Machiavelli's personal and psychological circumstances in the period immediately before and after its composition. Viroli suggests that Machiavelli, upon his release in February 1513 from Medicean confinement, during which he had been tortured, was disconsolate and devastated. Drawing on a number of the Florentine's letters written during the period after The Prince was completed, Viroli concludes that "As time went by, Machiavelli's mood was even more melancholic and depressed" (p. 62) so that he would have been incapable of composing the vigorous and rhetorically powerful case contained in Chapter 26. Viroli claims that he is not engaging in psychological reductionism, but only providing a historical context for understanding the meaning of The Prince. I am not, however, convinced that these biographical observations add very much to Viroli's defense of his interpretation of Machiavelli. Indeed, inasmuch as they rely on Viroli's wholly subjective judgment that Machiavelli's mood prevented him from writing Chapter 26 after the rest of The Prince, his claims in this regard detract from his argument and are, in any case, unnecessary.

The next chapters of Redeeming the Prince address two of the central interpretive problems posed by The Prince: the character of Machiavelli's alleged "realism" and the use he made of rhetorical techniques. The latter issue Viroli already tackled extensively in his 1998 survey of Machiavelli's thought. What he adds here to his previous work is a careful exposition of how Machiavelli employed a wide range of rhetorical devices specifically in the "Exhortation." Rhetoric, of course, is commonly understood as the application of persuasive language (often of an emotional sort) in order to inspire its audience to act in some desired fashion. In particular, Machiavelli's invocation of prophetic wording in Chapter 26, according to Viroli, reflects the overarching purpose of The Prince: the call for a redeemer, presumably Lorenzo de' Medici, to unify Italy in order to remove the foreign elements that have dominated its politics. Machiavelli says that such a redeemer is sanctioned by God, who has rendered the moment propitious for such action. Viroli insists that we must take Machiavelli at his word in this regard, rather than dismissing it as incompatible with the general message of The Prince.

That supposed "general message" helps us to grasp the sense in which Machiavelli may be characterized as a realist for Viroli. Specifically, Viroli asserts that Machiavelli adopts the stance of a "realist with imagination." By this he means that Machiavelli perfectly well understood the situation of Italy as it existed in his own day; this is his "realist" dimension. Yet he posits that Machiavelli was also engaged in an imaginative way to change such reality by promoting a savior, a redeemer, capable of instituting the reforms necessary to transform the realities of his day. On Viroli's account, Machiavelli pursued this agenda by mythologizing the great men of bygone times as well as some of his contemporaries. Thus, he mythologizes the redeemers whom he lauds in Chapters 6 and 26 -- such as Moses, Cyrus and Theseus -- as well as recent political figures such as Caterina Sforza and (especially) Cesare Borgia, both of whom he had encountered during his days in the Florentine civil service. Their deeds are transformed by him without regard to their actual behavior, for which Machiavelli has no use. Machiavelli's realism, then, is not confined to an effort to analyze and explain political events and personalities, past and present, in the manner of a political scientist. Rather, he renders his favored subjects larger than life, with the purpose of exhorting the redeemer to aim at their example, even if he falls short.

Viroli rounds out the book with a chapter examining the reception of Machiavelli's ideas in later times, particularly in the nineteenth century, in order to demonstrate that his reading of The Prince is not unprecedented. Although Viroli readily admits that early modern interpretations either condemned Machiavelli or emphasized his republicanism, he identifies a fundamental transformation in the understanding of The Prince occurring c.1800. This shift was led by German thinkers such as Hegel and Fichte, as well as the Italian man of letters Vittorio Alfieri, all of whom recognized and embraced Machiavelli's message of redemption. According to Viroli, this approach to interpreting Machiavelli soon spread to both England and France. Moreover, Viroli surveys Italian scholarship on Machiavelli during the first half of the twentieth century and finds that many of its leading practitioners picked up on and extended the themes of the "Exhortation." In this sense, Viroli has merely resuscitated and restated a line of interpretation that has a good pedigree. Does this imply that his reading of The Prince is unoriginal? By no means. Although inspired by earlier authors (as are many scholars), Viroli has presented a systematic and cogent approach to Machiavelli that had been largely forgotten but that presents important insights into the structure and meaning of The Prince. Whether or not they agree with Viroli, all students of Machiavelli owe him gratitude for calling our attention to an alternative way of conceiving The Prince.