Rediscovering Empathy: Agency, Folk Psychology, and the Human Sciences

Placeholder book cover

Karsten R. Stueber, Rediscovering Empathy: Agency, Folk Psychology, and the Human Sciences, MIT Press, 276pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 026219550X.

Reviewed by Janet Levin, University of Southern California


In Rediscovering Empathy, Karsten Stueber argues that empathy is "epistemically central to our folk psychological ability to understand other agents" (ix), and presents a view of empathetic understanding designed to incorporate insights from both the simulation theory and the "theory theory" of our ability to "read" other minds.  He begins the book with an interesting review of the history of appeals to empathy in the social sciences, continues with a discussion of the role of rational agency in our folk psychological conception of mind (Chs. 1-2), reviews (evenhandedly) the debate between simulation theorists and theory theorists about how we attribute mental states to others (Ch. 3), develops his own view, avowedly inspired by Collingwood, about the role of empathy in mental state attributions (Chs. 4-5), and concludes with an appraisal of "the limits of empathy" (Ch. 6).

Though the book contains many discussions of philosophical and historical interest, I will focus on what I take to be its primary, and structuring, thesis.  Namely, that:

the centrality of empathy or simulation to our understanding of other agents … is not decided merely by appealing to empirical arguments about underlying causal mechanisms [but] requires an appeal to a priori considerations that reveal empathy to be epistemically essential for our understanding of rational agency -- a concept that … is central to our conception of other persons in the folk-psychological realm.  (131)

I am sympathetic with Stueber's contention that determining the neural causes of our mental state attributions is not sufficient for establishing -- or denying -- the role of empathy or simulation in our understanding of others, and that conceptual considerations (loose and empirically informed though they may be) cannot be ignored.  I also endorse his claim, in the build-up to this thesis, that our taking ourselves to have reasons for our own actions involves a crucial first-personal element.

However, though Stueber's considerations support the view that empathy can, and perhaps normally does, play an important role in our understanding of others, they do not establish that this role is "epistemically essential".  One problem is that there is another way of construing the first-personal component of our typical rationalizations of our own actions that does not entail the need for what Stueber calls "reenactive empathy" in our understanding of other agents.  Another problem is that he underestimates the resources available for third-personal attribution of reasons for action.  In addition, I'm not convinced that the concept of rational agency is, or need be, "central to our [folk psychological] conception of other persons" -- or that establishing this thesis is necessary for Stueber's project.  It seems that we could take an irrational person's behavior to be intelligible in light of her mental states at the time as long as we are, or can imagine being, irrational in the same way.  If anything, the need for empathy to predict her actions might be particularly acute in just such cases!  However, I will not pursue this worry here.

Early in Chapter 4, the heart of his theory of empathy, Stueber distinguishes between "basic" and "reenactive" empathy.  Basic empathy, he argues, is a quasi-perceptual phenomenon that "allows us to directly recognize what another person is doing or feeling" when observing her facial expressions or behavior (147).  This phenomenon, he speculates, is underlain by the activity of mirror neuron systems, which -- as Stueber explains it -- are activated both when "we [observe] another person's action and [recognize] his emotion based on his facial expressions and … when we ourselves feel the same emotion or execute the same action" (116).

This is an interesting suggestion, and it may well be true.[1]  However, it's not clear why basic empathy (or its mirror neuron underpinnings) should be required for making my recognition of another person's feelings direct.  Presumably, I can directly recognize that someone is angry or in pain by means of observing her facial expressions, as long as my belief that she is in those states is not based on inference from the occurrence of those facial expressions to the occurrence of those mental states.  But, while mirror neuron activity may "automatically" prompt me to believe that people are angry or in pain when I observe their characteristic expressions, this automatic prompting can also be accomplished, as Stueber acknowledges, on "analogy to how theoretical terms can [come, by someone with experience in the domain, to] be used as observational terms" (140).  This suggests that basic empathy may merely be an efficient, but not the only, way to arrive "directly" at such beliefs (or to effect justification of those beliefs if, as Stueber often suggests, justification is a matter of those characteristic expressions’ being reliable indicators of basic emotions and sensations).

Stueber worries that, without empathy, we wouldn't have univocal concepts of such feelings that can be applied both to ourselves and to others, since "[w]hereas I know how your face looks when you are angry, I normally do not have a visual representation of my own facial expression when I am angry.  All that I have to go on is a kinaesthetic-proprioceptive representation of the tension in my facial muscle" (141).  But Stueber doesn't make clear why perceptual representations of the same property by means of different sense modalities don't count as instances of the same perceptual concept.  The surge of recent work on Molyneux's Question suggests that this question remains open.

Later in Chapter 4, Stueber broadens his focus, arguing that basic empathy cannot by itself enable us to "explain and predict a person's behavior in complex social situations" or even provide "a full grasp of all mental concepts that we attribute to the typical adult" (147); for this we need more "theoretical" information about the interrelations among mental states, stimulations, and behavior.  However, he contends, these more sophisticated "mind-reading" abilities also require what he calls "reenactive empathy", a conclusion he reaches by means of the arguments from the essential contextuality and indexicality of thoughts as reasons (sec. 4.2).  These are the crucial arguments for his claim that empathy is epistemically essential for our understanding of others as rational agents.

Stueber introduces these arguments (inspired, he notes, by Collingwood, and introduced into the debate between simulation and theory theorists by Jane Heal) by claiming that the thought processes we take to provide reasons for behavior (or other mental states) cannot be regarded "merely as causal sequences", but as processes evaluable in light of "our best theories of rationality" (153).  He contends that while deductive, inductive, and practical principles can tell us which claims it would be logically permissible to infer from an agent's antecedent beliefs, they are silent about which among these antecedent beliefs it would be rational for that agent to use in her practical reasoning, since this depends on what she takes to be important, or salient, and also on her further beliefs and values (156).  But only if we know the latter will we be able to understand that agent's thoughts as reasons for her actions.  As Stueber puts it later, "[u]nderstanding thoughts as reasons of rational agents requires us to solve what has become known as the frame problem" (157), and this is soluble, he suggests, only if  I can "put myself in their shoes and practically evaluate what aspects of the situation have to be regarded as relevant using my own rational capacity for making that judgment" (160).  This is the argument from the contextuality of our reasons-based attribution of thoughts to others.

However, while Stueber may be correct in holding that "merely formal and syntactic theories … can never be sufficient for characterizing rational thought and decision processes" (155), this does not exhaust the resources of third-person attribution.  If there are even approximate principles, descriptive or normative, that specify which features of certain types of situations will, or should, be salient for any agent with certain interests and values (and propensities to be bound by certain norms), then all we would have to know is what values, interests and proclivities the agent in question has.  Such commonalities (and particulars) may be hard to determine, but if reenactive empathy leads to accuracy in prediction, they presumably exist, and it is hard to see why they could not be available to theory theorists, at least in principle.  These considerations can also help to counter another worry that Stueber introduces later (193-94), namely, that belief-desire explanations of a person's action will not be plausible unless those beliefs and desires can be taken to be reasons for that agent in that particular situation, and that the only way to determine this is to empathize with that agent.

Thus, it seems, the argument from contextuality establishes only the heuristic value, and not the necessity, of reenactive empathy for reasons attribution.  Not that this is implausible -- or trivial:  if reenactive empathy has a heuristic role in this endeavor, then it can be an important practical tool for our understanding of others.  And sometimes it seems that this is all that Stueber wants to claim, as when he characterizes this phenomenon as "central" to our ability to understand others (161), or as the "default" mode for our understanding of others (167), or as the most psychologically plausible theory of what people actually do (167).  But if he wants to claim, as he sometimes does (194), that it plays an essential role in the attribution of mental states to others, this argument falls short.

Stueber's second a priori argument appeals to the essential indexicality of thoughts as reasons.  This argument, he says, "consists of two steps.  First, it claims that from the first-person perspective we can grasp a thought as a reason [for our own action] only if we identify it as our own …  Second, [it] claims that to understand how another's belief could be a reason for her action we must "imaginatively entertain the belief ourselves … and imaginatively identify the thought as our own" (162).

But it is this argument, I believe, that misconstrues what goes on when we, from the first person, give reasons for our actions.  Admittedly, if (as in Stueber's example) I'm conceiving of the belief that President Clinton had an affair as a reason for my expressing dissatisfaction with him, I "minimally have to conceive of it as my thought.  Recognizing that Linda has such a thought could not constitute a reason for my actions" (162).  But it's not clear that I (normally) invoke my beliefs at all when I offer reasons for my actions from the first person.

If asked why I expressed dissatisfaction with Clinton, for example, I might say (something like) "because he had an affair" (and perhaps "because having an affair shows bad political judgment").  When I am giving my current reasons for an action, that is, I don't normally cite my mental states, but rather (what I take to be) certain facts about the world.  For me to be able to do this, of course, I have to have a particular first-person perspective on the world, to have conscious beliefs that the world is a certain way.  But I don't normally invoke my having these beliefs when giving reasons for what I do.

Later on, particularly if I come to doubt that Clinton had an affair, or change my mind about whether having an affair shows bad political judgment, I may cite those beliefs to explain my earlier expression of dissatisfaction.  And I won't count them as giving reasons for my action unless I can identify those beliefs as mine.  But doing this does not seem to require anything more than the standard third-personal tools of the theory theorists; my previous affirmation of the content of the belief, and the role of that state in my practical reasoning, allows it to be cited, legitimately, as (part of) my reason for my vote.  It's unclear, therefore, why we would need to do anything more than cite the fact that another person has, and is reasoning with, some conscious belief in order to understand it as a reason for her action -- in particular, it's unclear why we should have to "imaginatively entertain [her] belief ourselves … and identify [it] as our own".

Stueber may well have a response to this objection:  for example, he criticizes Gordon's version of the simulation theory for characterizing the reasons one gives for one's actions, from the first person, in a similar way (132-3; Ch. 3, note 18).  But it would be helpful to have a fuller articulation of his worry.  Indeed, this is true of a number of Stueber's theses.  Another that could use more discussion and defense is Stueber's preferred account of mental state concepts, in conjunction with his criteria for what an adequate account should be.  Stueber endorses Davidsonian meaning holism, and though he acknowledges that "holistic intuitions lose some of their grip" for "basic emotions and concepts like belief" (148), he maintains that "competence in the full range of folk-psychological concepts that we normally attribute to adult human beings requires some minimal theoretical grasp of the nature of mental states and how they might interact" (149).  But why?

For Stueber, it seems, the only alternatives to holism are logical behaviorism and the "Cartesian" view that all mental states are denoted in introspection by "private ostensive definition".  It seems reasonable to treat logical behaviorism as unacceptable, and "Cartesianism" to be implausible for many mental states.  But Stueber's reasons for rejecting what may be called a "recognitional-demonstrative" account of our concepts of "basic" emotions and sensations are that such a theory wouldn't be "comprehensive"; that is, provide a unified account of all mental state concepts, or be "univocal"; that is, permit the same mental state concepts to be used in first- and third-person attributions.  But it's not clear why an adequate account of metal state concepts needs to characterize phenomenal and intentional states in the same way.  And it's not clear why we couldn't apply the recognitional-demonstrative concepts acquired from our own experience to another person projectively:  to propose, when observing or speculating about another person, that she feels like that.  Stueber argues (citing Wittgenstein) that "[i]f my grasp of a mental concept is constituted by my experiencing something in a certain way, then it is impossible for me to conceive of how somebody could be in the same mental state, for that would require that I can conceive of my mental state as something that I do not experience …" (135).  But the claim that I can grasp a mental concept only from my own experience is distinct from the claim that it's part of that concept that it can be applied only to my own experiences, so Stueber needs to show why the Wittgensteinian worry is relevant here.

In addition, there are alternatives to holism about mental state concepts distinct from both Cartesianism and logical behaviorism.  Thus, it would be particularly helpful to see a fuller defense of Stueber's holism, especially since, as he suggests (151), the concessions to the theory theory that it demands give pride of place to his arguments for reenactive empathy from the "essential contextuality and indexicality of thoughts as reasons".  A better appreciation of Stueber's grounds for endorsing meaning holism would provide the reader with a better understanding of why he relies so heavily on these arguments for the importance of empathy in our understanding of others.

[1] Though see Alison Gopnik, "Cells That Read Minds?", in Slate, April 26, 2007, for a cautionary note about the appeal to mirror neurons.