Rediscovering Political Friendship: Aristotle's Theory and Modern Identity, Community, and Equality

Rediscovering Political Friendship

Paul W. Ludwig, Rediscovering Political Friendship: Aristotle's Theory and Modern Identity, Community, and Equality, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 347pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107022966.

Reviewed by Jonny Thakkar, Swarthmore College


Those of us who live in liberal democracies do not tend to think of ourselves as connected to our fellow citizens by bonds of friendship. Most of us recognize special obligations towards our fellow citizens on account of our shared membership in a given society. We find it natural, for instance, that more of our tax dollars go to welfare programs within our own country than to overseas aid. But if pushed on why that is, we would be unlikely to invoke the notion of friendship. The concept of friendship seems to apply at a fundamentally different scale to the concept of citizenship: even in the era of Facebook, it still evokes relatively small-scale networks that tie individuals together on the basis of idiosyncratic affinities and histories. Aristotle, by contrast, gives a crucial place in his political theory to the notion of friendship between citizens. Was he simply using the word in a different way to us? Or might he, as Paul W. Ludwig suggests in the book, have something important to teach us?

Ludwig’s contention is that civic friendship is both underappreciated and all around us — the problem is just that our current theoretical frameworks don’t recognize it for what it is. This is not simply an epistemic failing, since those frameworks create what he calls “blowback”: in underestimating the valuable civic friendship that actually exists, we are liable also to undermine it, or at least to fail to strengthen it. The “best use of civic friendship theory” is therefore not to ground a critique of liberal modernity (for example as alienating us from our natural propensity to live in genuine community with one another), but rather “to supplement and bolster” liberalism. The thesis that civic friendship is all around us might immediately strike the reader as naïve, especially with respect to today’s United States — and in the end I believe it is — but there is much to be learned from Ludwig’s attempt to prove it.

Ludwig arrives at his thesis via a close reading of Aristotle, for whom (in Ludwig’s words) “citizens are civic friends when they share an agreement about important practical matters: preeminently, they agree about the regime, their political system” (2). If citizens agree about the value of their political system, Ludwig claims, they will treat one another with the favoritism that is the hallmark of friendship. This is not the ethically demanding true friendship of Aristotle’s virtuous men, however, but rather the friendship of utility that counts as friendship by analogy to that true friendship. Simply by being part of the same cooperative scheme, both economically and politically, we benefit one another and thereby come to form affectionate bonds that are sufficient for us to speak of friendship.

Chapter 1 draws on Plato and Aristotle to develop a theory according to which friendship is necessarily bound up with “irascible passions”. The fundamental claims are that “our capacity to love is dependent on our capacities for anger and self-assertion” (26), and that this helps us see that contemporary identity politics is really a “resurgence within liberalism” of passions linked to friendship and love. To argue for this claim Ludwig takes us to Plato’s Lysis, where he finds Socrates assuming that what makes people loveable is their usefulness to us, before shifting to the thought that we love only our own (to oikeion). Even though the Lysis is aporetic, Ludwig thinks Aristotle drew on its suggestions regarding utility and identity to form a workable theory of his own. In Politics 7 Aristotle makes the peculiar claim that “spirit (thumos) is what produces friendliness (philētikon), since it is the capacity of the soul by which we love (philoumen)” (1327b40-1328a1), offering as evidence the fact that we tend to get more angry with friends who slight us than with strangers who do likewise.[1] If we assume that spirit is anger, as Ludwig argues we should, then Aristotle appears to be claiming that friendship is grounded in anger. This leads Ludwig to argue against Charles Taylor that contemporary identity politics will necessarily also be the politics of angry self-assertion, the thought being that identity politics depends on the notion of group friendship, and group friendship necessarily involves angry self-assertion. Ludwig ends the chapter by suggesting that liberalism can defuse this problem if it redirects our focus away from static cultural or racial identities and towards flexible vocational identities, in which specialization affords each party a certain kind of superiority while reciprocity guarantees a certain kind of equality.

The idea that economic relationships can supplant racial and cultural identities might seem implausible, but Ludwig develops it further in the next chapter, arguing that by making use of others in economic and political life we start to identify with them, and so expand our sense of self. In Book VIII, Chapter 2 of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle claims that the goodwill (eunoia) that contains the seed of friendship can arise when we merely suppose someone to be either good or useful (1155b35-1156a1). True friendship involves wishing good things for people on account of who they really are, rather than on account of the utility they provide, but it also requires joint action: we must find pleasure in living in each other’s company and provide goods for one another (1156a11-1156b33; 1166b35-1167a5; 1157b6-13). As Ludwig points out, this last criterion — that friends provide goods for one another — suggests that even the true friendship of the virtuous must involve a form of utility higher than that available through commercial transactions (1158a21-31). Ludwig’s suggestion is that true friends make possible noble actions, including forms of self-sacrifice and benefaction and above all joint contemplation, which yields the “still higher (in metaphysical terms) utility of activating faculties, where using is the only product the activity produces” (117). Civic friendship does not rise to that level, but for Ludwig the moral of the story is that “Utility will have at least an underground role in all friendships” (121). If policymakers want to encourage friendships to grow in society, they therefore need to allow us to benefit one another. This requires encouraging us to volunteer in social projects and being wary of social security programs that might undermine the cross-generational utility friendships that bind families and communities together.

Chapters 3 and 4 form a continuous argument. The first argues that liberal theories unsuccessfully try to replace civic friendship with an “enlightened self-interest” according to which bonding with others via “spontaneously-forming groups”, or associations, is necessary to serve individual interests (133). Ludwig claims that seminal liberal thinkers adopted “a Jansenist account of self-interest” according to which “self-love is never a basis for true love of others”, leaving us with a binary of selfish and self-sacrificing motives (134). This condemns us to viewing civic friendship — understood as utility-based — as merely selfish relative to pure altruism. The associations of civil society, meanwhile, have to be explained on the basis of rational self-interest alone, which is notoriously hard to do. This in turn creates the “blowback” mentioned earlier, “encouraging unethical behavior and eroding citizens’ moral character” (153, 160, 246). If we were to use the language of civic friendship and the psychology of thumos, by contrast, we would both more accurately describe the reality of our own world and thereby improve it.

As Chapter 4 makes clear, Ludwig is aware that the small-scale friendship that takes place within families and local associations can come into conflict with the friendship that holds between citizens as such, but in his view both count as forms of civic friendship, with the former (as Aristotle argued against Plato) being necessary for the latter. Ideally, small-scale groups would take a form “that permits their parochial loves to radiate outwards to include, or grow into, larger feelings for the whole” (185). But on Ludwig’s view, it is more important to give these groups power than to guard against deformations, since without genuine power they will generate no feelings of attachment anyway.

Local associations will only count as forms of civic friendship if they are woven into a tapestry of society-wide civic friendship, but how is the larger form possible? This is the question Ludwig addresses in Chapters 5 to 7. In his view, the contemporary communitarian vision of civic friendship is too demanding for mass societies, requiring widespread virtue and failing to grasp Aristotle’s point that mass friendship can only ever count as friendship “by analogy” (191). Instead, Ludwig advises us to base our account of civic friendship in a fairly thin account of human nature such as that found in Locke. Aristotelian theory can achieve this thanks to Aristotle’s emphasis on the importance of economic activity to civic friendship. At the start of Book VIII of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle suggests that what generates the equality requisite for friendship is proportion between what is given and what is received, and that in civic friendship the measure of this proportion is money (to nomisma). This ties in with his Book V claims that “a city is kept together by proportionate reciprocation” (1132b34-35) and that by social convention money has come to serve as a measure of how much has been given and how much received.[2] This vision of economic life as a locus of civic friendship might seem romantic today, but Ludwig points out that even today we are liable to boycott the products of those we despise or resent and to go out of our way to give business to traders we have become attached to.

In chapter 6, Ludwig argues that rather than presupposing citizenly virtue — and hence the program of education and coercion necessary to achieve it — Aristotelian civic friendship gives us a motive to want to be virtuous. Although Aristotle’s ideal regime requires full ethical virtue, the best practicable regime, “polity”, does not require “a virtue that is beyond the reach of private individuals” (1295a25-31). What fosters civic friendship and community is rather the strength of its middle class, which permits a high degree of equality between its citizens (1295b23-28). Admittedly, the goal of polity remains noble action, albeit relative to the regime’s standards, and citizens want each other to be virtuous in that sense — but civic friendship appears to be a means to this virtuous activity rather than its product (1280b1-5 and 1280b36-1281a8). Because civic friendship “supplies a motive for citizens to wish to behave virtuously”, it promises to remedy liberalism’s tendency to erode the virtue of its citizens (245).

To sustain it, Ludwig argues in Chapter 7, we need “political concord”. Aristotle writes that a city is in concord (homonoia) “when people agree about what is beneficial, rationally choose the same things, and carry out common resolutions” with respect to the most important matters such as the constitution or the broad outlines of foreign policy (1167a27-33). This leads Ludwig to conclude that constitutional patriotism can foster civic friendship even in liberal regimes: “Citizens who esteem the same thing have reason to esteem — or at least to feel an affinity for — each other . . . [and] the regime in turn reliably produces citizens of a certain type — the type they have an affinity for” (268). Aristotle would probably have considered modern liberal societies too large to count as genuine regimes, Ludwig acknowledges, but we have reason to think otherwise.

Ludwig concludes with an idiosyncratic list of policy recommendations, “both social conservative and progressive” (297), that he thinks will preserve and enhance civic friendship. We need a “just wage” that allows poorer citizens to feel their contribution is valued by the community and thereby minimizes resentment and discord (302-304). We need to legitimize skepticism over immigration where it derives from a concern for the regime. We need to encourage local patronage rather than generalized philanthropy, and we should therefore avoid criticizing the “egoism of generosity” (311, 320). Finally, we need institutional national military service for young people in order to form habits of public service (323-324).

The book is an impressive piece of political theory. Ludwig is a careful and reliable guide to Aristotle, and he is so erudite that it is hard to imagine a reader who wouldn’t learn from his close readings of the Ethics and Politics or his ancillary discussions of thinkers such as Plato, Machiavelli, Locke, Montesquieu, Kant and Tocqueville. On top of that, the book’s central argument — that once we understand civic friendship correctly, that is, in terms of economic and political utility, we will see that it already undergirds liberal democracies — is both challenging and important. Having said that, it should be noted that the book is not always an easy read: the main thread that I have pulled out is often obscured by the interpretative or argumentative digressions just mentioned, and when discussing contemporary political life the tone can be stilted. Specialists in ancient philosophy will no doubt have their quibbles in places — I wasn’t convinced that Aristotle thinks friendship is grounded in anger and money measures honour — but given the telos of the project, the most important objections will be to Ludwig’s account of liberalism.

If one of Ludwig’s central claims is that liberalism has mistakenly left civic friendship out of its theories, then an obvious response is to look for counterexamples. John Rawls, the high priest of twentieth century left-liberalism, argued that his difference principle should be understood “as an interpretation of the principle of fraternity”.[3] Admittedly, fraternity is not quite the same as friendship, but since they clearly occupy similar territory it is a shame that Ludwig does not pay more attention to Sibyl Schwarzenbach’s attempt to build a Rawlsian account of civic friendship instead of simply endorsing Michael Sandel’s one-eyed criticism of Rawls as assuming an “unencumbered self”.[4]

If Ludwig might reasonably be accused of unfairness towards liberal theory, with respect to liberal practice the accusation would have to be of excessive generosity. “Likemindedness in liberal democracies is unprecedented, historically,” he writes. “We call it consent of the governed” (15). But do today’s governed really consent, or do they simply acquiesce? If America is the focal case, as Ludwig seems to assume, then a skeptic might point to the huge number of Americans who never see fit to vote, or to the seemingly never-ending efforts on the part of political operatives to ensure that fewer people vote, as evidence that neither the masses nor the elites truly exemplify homonoia regarding the virtues of liberal democratic principles. Ludwig’s claims regarding economic life seem equally rose-tinted. While it is true that economic exchange offers opportunities for civic friendship, Marx was surely right that it also offers opportunities for exploitation. In that respect Ludwig’s failure to consider Aristotle’s critique of moneymaking in Book I of the Politics or Marx’s attempt to inherit that critique is unfortunate.

In the American case, it is hard to consider political and economic discord without also considering the history of racial enmity and oppression. Even supposing that Ludwig is right to argue that stabilizing liberalism requires replacing racial identities with vocational ones (68-69), these identities are surely relevant to the question of whether civic friendship actually obtains in the here and now. One hopes that a society built on slavery might eventually become a society grounded in civic friendship, but Ludwig’s account, according to which civic friendship is not a normative ideal but rather a descriptive fact, seems to leave little room for asking where we are in that process and what is necessary to advance it.


[1] All translations taken from Aristotle, Politics, tr. C. D. C. Reeve (Hackett, 2017).

[2] All translations taken from Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, tr. Roger Crisp (Cambridge University Press, 2014).

[3] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice: Revised Edition, p. 90 (Oxford University Press, 1999). Another example would be Ronald Dworkin, who attempts to ground political obligation in the notion of a “true fraternal mode of association” grounded in a shared quest for coherent principles. See Dworkin, Law’s Empire, pp. 206-215 (Harvard University Press, 1986).

[4] Sibyl A. Schwarzenbach, On Civic Friendship: Including Women in the State (Columbia University Press, 2009), especially chapter 5.