Reduction: Between the Mind and the Brain

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Alexander Hieke and Hannes Leitgeb (eds.), Reduction: Between the Mind and the Brain, Ontos, 2009, 219pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380460.

Université Pierre Mendès France, Grenoble/Institut Jean Nicod, Paris

Reviewed by Max Kistler, Université Pierre Mendès France, Grenoble/Institut Jean Nicod, Paris



This volume is a collection of essays presented at the 31st International Wittgenstein Symposium, Kirchberg, in August 2008. It has the character of a high-quality journal issue. There is no introduction, and the papers do not all directly bear on the topic of the original conference, which was “Reduction and Elimination in Philosophy and the Sciences”. In what follows, I offer a short description of each paper, and add critical remarks in some cases.

Jerry Fodor defends the possibility of naturalizing various concepts required for psychological explanation, both semantic, such as true, entails, refers to, and mental attitude concepts, such as believes, acts, thinks, etc. Critics have argued that these concepts are normative and therefore cannot be analyzed in a naturalistic way. Fodor replies that this criticism loses its plausibility as soon as one distinguishes between symbols of natural languages and mental/cerebral symbols required, according to Fodor, by psychological explanations. From the fact that the meaning of the former is determined by norms of communication, it doesn’t follow that this is also the case for the symbols of a Language of Thought. Fodor shows that this distinction allows him to refute a series of arguments against the possibility of a naturalistic analysis of the intensional concepts used in psychological explanation.

Johannes Brandl’s paper is a contribution to the debate on the explanation of intentionality. Brandl distinguishes two research programs: informational semantics, grounded on the idea that intentional states have the function of tracking information about (states of) the environment, and phenomenological semantics, according to which intentionality is grounded on conscious experience. Brandl’s aim is to criticize two arguments, due to E.J. Lowe and U. Kriegel, according to which the first program is deeply flawed or even inconsistent. Lowe argues that genuine intentionality can only exist in systems with phenomenal experience. The fact that robots may have internal states that have the function of carrying information shows that the conditions imposed by informational semantics are insufficient for genuine intentionality. The result of Brandl’s analysis of the debate between Lowe and the advocates of informational semantics is that all arguments used there are ultimately question begging. The upshot of Kriegel’s argument is that an essential thesis of informational semantics is that “representing something involves constitutively bearing a relation to it”, and that this thesis is refuted by the possibility of representing non-existents (21). However, Brandl argues, informational semantics is only committed to postulate such a relation to explain the veridicality of a representation. Representational content is grounded on relations to what is represented; however this is compatible with the possibility that the content of many representational states is determined by their functional role.

Before suggesting a new analysis of the notion of acceptance, Fabio Paglieri offers a critique of three alternative conceptions. He shows that the notion of acceptance used in van Fraassen’s constructive empiricism is “molar” rather than atomic, insofar as it can be analyzed in terms of other concepts, in this case belief in the observable consequences of the scientific theories one accepts and commitments to act in certain ways. Van Fraassen’s notion of acceptance is used only for scientific theories, and being analyzable, it is not a primitive or indispensable concept of epistemology. Michael Bratman has defended the thesis that acceptance is such a primitive, which is independent of belief, so that there are both cases of accepting without believing and of believing without accepting. Paglieri shows that these cases can in fact be better analyzed without using acceptance, by belief in possibilities with various probabilities. He argues that acceptance is not useful in accounting for behavioral routines where agents act against some beliefs.

Paglieri begins the constructive part of his paper with an analysis of what it means to accept a conditional statement in terms of the Ramsey test. It has been shown that, on both standard interpretations of the Ramsey test, accepting a conditional is not equivalent to believing it. Paglieri then suggests that acceptance is equivalent to a conditional disposition: “accepting a certain state of affairs X means to be disposed to believe X and/or to act on X, but only when certain circumstances occur” (42). The conditionality of acceptance explains the respect in which it is context-sensitive: what is context-dependent according to Paglieri is not the acceptance but the belief or action by which the acceptance disposition manifests itself. As H. Leitgeb (2007) has suggested, such dispositions are single-track, whereas beliefs are multi-track dispositions. Paglieri’s view differs from Leitgeb’s in that he takes acceptance to be neither purely epistemic nor cognitive; rather, it is a “transformational attitude” (46).

Jaegwon Kim argues that defenders of the existence of emergent properties and laws have not succeeded in working out a coherent concept of ontological emergence, and that no such account can in particular be found in the masterpiece of British emergentism, C. D. Broad’s Mind and its Place in Nature. Emergent phenomena are supposed to be supervenient on physical facts but not deducible from them. Kim argues that emergentists have found no way of escaping the paradox that ontologically emergent phenomena would have to be “both logically supervenient and not logically supervenient on basal facts”, where these facts are meant to include the laws bearing on the “basal” level of fundamental physics (70). Kim’s point is not that it is factually wrong that there are emergent phenomena, but that the hypothesis of their existence is conceptually incoherent.

However, Kim’s argument is not conclusive as long as he has not considered the following conceptual possibility (whether or not it corresponds to Broad’s doctrine, and whether or not it turns out to be correct). The crucial point concerns the laws that Broad calls “transordinal” and E. Nagel (1961) calls “bridge laws”: it seems coherent to suppose that emergent phenomena, e.g. conscious states, supervene on microphysical facts and laws, which do not include transordinal laws. Given the transordinal laws, facts of consciousness supervene on facts and laws of microphysics. The transordinal laws make it the case that there can be no difference in conscious states without a difference in the underlying physical states. The supervenience base does not in itself determine the facts of consciousness, and the latter cannot be deduced from the former. Maybe Kim doesn’t consider this possibility because he presents supervenience as equivalent to determination (“let F be a property of a whole which is determined by, or supervenient on, properties and structural relations characterizing its constituents” (59)). However, as he has shown himself (Kim 1993), supervenience is a very weak and metaphysically superficial relation of covariance, which does not entail determination or dependence. In (Kim 1993), he explains that a dualist can subscribe to the supervenience of mental facts on physical facts, and hold that this supervenience is not grounded on the determination of the mental by the physical, but rather, e.g., on the determination of both the physical and the mental by God. An analogous move is open to the emergentist: she can hold that mental facts supervene on physical facts (and laws), but that this supervenience is grounded not on the dependence of the mental facts on the physical facts and laws, but on the transordinal laws determining the mental facts on the basis of the physical facts and laws. Then mental facts are not logically deducible from physical facts and laws, and this impossibility of deduction is absolute and has nothing to do with our epistemic limitations.

Markus Schlosser challenges the first step of Kim’s famous argument against mental causation. There, Kim argues that strong local supervenience of mental properties on physical properties entails that there are only two ways (the instance of) a mental property M at time t can cause (the instance of) a second mental property M* at time t*: given that P*, the local supervenience base of M*, already completely determines M*, either M is redundant and overdetermines M* or M causes M* indirectly, by causing P* on a downward causal path. Considering overdetermination to be implausible, Kim concludes that mental causation requires downward causation. Schlosser observes that the argument crucially depends on the thesis of local supervenience. According to a widely accepted account, the identity of an action depends on its history, so that the supervenience base of an action A is not synchronic with the behavior B constitutive of the action but includes part of B’s causal history. On such an etiological account of actions, the local supervenience base P* of B does not in itself determine A. Thus, it is conceptually coherent that a mental event M causes B, without overdetermining A (because P* does not in itself determine A) and without M causing A via P* (for the same reason). Even if Schlosser’s argument is restricted to actions and does not question the soundness of Kim’s argument concerning other mental events without an etiological essence (such as pain or other qualia), its result is important: an important category of mental causation, the causation of actions, does not require downward causation and thus does not fall prey to the second step of Kim’s argument, which shows downward causation to be incompatible with the causal closure of the physical domain.

However, it seems to be quite easy to modify Kim’s argument so as to bypass Schlosser’s objection and yield the result that the causation of actions requires downward causation after all. Take an action of type A whose characteristic behavior is B, but which has externalist identity conditions: it belongs to category A only insofar as its constitutive behavior B is caused by mental cause M. Therefore, causing an action is not causing B, but causing the whole process of M’s causing B. But now, the process of M’s causing B supervenes on a physical process (say P’s causing P*) whose duration does not exceed the duration of M’s causing B. Here is the modified version of Kim’s argument: If C is the cause of M’s causing B, C can only cause M’s causing B by either overdetermining it (because P’s causing P* also determines M’s causing B) or by downward causation of P’s causing P*. Considering a similar objection, Schlosser replies that P’s causing P* does not “realize and determine” (82) M’s causing B: M rationalizes B, whereas P does not rationalize P*, because “rationality and reason-explanation have ‘no echo’ in the physical domain” (82). This reply seems beside the point: whether X rationalizes Y depends on whether there is a practical syllogism leading from X, together with other premises, to Y, where X and Y are propositions that may describe events. Nothing of the sort appears in the premises of our Kim-style argument, which depends only on the premise (which Schlosser seems to accept) that M’s causing B supervenes on P’s causing P*.

Paul Egré suggests a way of better understanding judgments categorizing percepts belonging to the vague boundaries between clear cases. Vague boundaries have been extensively studied in the context of the sorites paradox. Let a subject be presented with a large number of color samples with shades intermediate between, say, yellow and orange, such that adjacent samples are pairwise indiscriminable. It is impossible that the first sample is judged yellow, the last orange, but that adjacent samples never differ in color. Egré suggests a new solution for the problem raised by such “soritical series” in perception, inspired by a psychological study of the perception of ambiguous figures (Fisher 1967). The example Egré uses is a figure that can be seen both as a man’s face and as a girl’s head and shoulders. Fisher has studied the perception of a “soritical” series of such figures. Each figure resembles the adjacent so much that it seems to belong to the same category — either man or girl; however, the first has a much greater tendency for being perceived as a man, and the last for being perceived as a girl. According to Egré’s analysis, the problematic intermediate stimuli have a specific power of eliciting each of two categories; the stimuli outside this ambiguous range are extreme cases, which elicit one specific category with probability 1. He distinguishes between the descriptive content of the so-called tolerance principle, according to which, if a is the probability that stimulus n is seen as A, then the probability that stimulus n+1 is seen as A is sufficiently close to a, from its normative content, according to which, if n ought to be judged A, and if n+1 is indiscriminable from n, then n+1 ought not to be judged not A (but some other category). Egré’s account takes up an idea from other recent work on vagueness: stimuli in the vague area at the border of categories allow for different categorizations. His paper shows the fecundity of the naturalistic perspective: looking at psychological experiments on ambiguous figures may suggest interpretive hypotheses that have escaped attention of those who consider the problem of soritical series from a purely logical and epistemological point of view.

In his chapter, Paul Schweizer argues that the computational paradigm of the mind makes it superfluous to postulate that the vehicles of computation have a content. Taking Fodor’s Language of Thought hypothesis as paradigmatic of the cognitive approach to the mind, he claims that content can play no role in mental/cerebral computations because it is essentially dependent on the environment and social community of the speaker or thinker, whereas computation can only be determined by local constraints. Schweizer acknowledges that “internal structures can encode, mirror or model external objects and states of affairs” and only claims that such internal structures lack “genuine aboutness” so that they could be correctly characterized by having “representation without intentionality” (126-127). He argues that “mere causal correlations” between internal states and their external referents are insufficient to ascribe “genuine aboutness” to them. This suggests that Schweizer argues against a strawman. Indeed, it is a central thesis of Fred Dretske’s and others’ work on the naturalization of intentionality that information, or “mere causal correlations”, is insufficient for representation, because a state can only represent a piece of information if it has the biological function of bearing that information. Schweizer says that internal states are “merely calibrated with the environment in which they happened to develop” (130), but overlooks the hypothesis that the causal history of this calibration might ground a naturalistic notion of wide content. It is also puzzling to argue that Fodor’s (1987) “narrow content”, insofar as it is a purely internal property of internal states, cannot literally be “content” because content is necessarily externalist, without mentioning that this reason has made Fodor (1994) himself give up the notion of narrow content.

Patrick Suppes’ chapter provides an upshot of much work he has done in more than five decades on human reasoning. His main claim is that the only fundamental mechanism of reasoning, both animal and human, is association. He sketches previously published accounts of four areas of reasoning: the computation of truth, the determination of Bayesian priors, the formation of habits as basis of rational choice, and the psychological verification of informal mathematical proofs. In each case, the reasoning that people actually carry out can be completely explained by the establishment, reinforcement or weakening of associations between representations, together with innate constraints on brain and cognitive architecture. The “nodes” thus associated can be representations of words, but also “auditory, visual, and other kinds of brain images” (142). Appeal to a priori rules of rationality is misleading and does not correspond to any constraint followed by real reasoners. In a short last section, Suppes sketches how the cognitive framework of the association of representations leads to empirically testable hypotheses about underlying processes in the brain.

William Bechtel and Adele Abrahamsen’s contribution shows that the analysis of biological mechanisms provides a fruitful alternative to the more traditional approach to reduction as deduction via bridge laws (Nagel 1961). They illustrate the main ideas of mechanistic analysis with the discovery of the mechanism underlying circadian rhythms, which tunes physiological processes in a cycle of approximately 24 hours. Bechtel and Abrahamsen show that the analysis of such biological mechanisms is discovered in many steps. After localizing a central part of the mechanism (in this case, cells in the suprachiasmatic nucleus SCN), it is decomposed into its functional parts and operations. Later these parts are conceptually reassembled to show that their orchestrated interaction yields the phenomenon to be explained. Other steps are needed to establish how the mechanism is integrated as a functional part in a larger mechanism, which is in this case the whole organism. It turns out that this higher level is necessary for understanding the functioning of the lower-level mechanism, insofar as processes taking place in peripheral organs provide feed-back to the central mechanism in the SCN. Bechtel and Abrahamsen argue that the mechanistic account of biological explanation undermines eliminativism with respect to higher-level concepts and phenomena: processes and interactions at higher-levels must be discovered and investigated at their own level. Higher-level concepts are not only heuristic and provisional (as J. Bickle 2003 claims), because parts and processes at several levels are essential to mechanistic explanation. This seems to entail the existence of downward causation. Against this, Bechtel and Abrahamsen report earlier work (C. F. Craver and W. Bechtel 2007), in which it is argued that what might at first sight appear as bottom-up or top-down can be analyzed exclusively in terms of same-level causation and constitution.

Joëlle Proust’s chapter shows that a detailed analysis of how the brain develops by building dynamic adaptive control structures helps justify Kim’s claim that the causal powers of mental properties are inherited from their physical realizers. The mental and the physical correspond to different levels of organization, which are integrated into control systems and evolve together through the organism’s interactions with its environment. The development of mental functions — both at the level of evolution and of individual development and learning — takes place at several interdependent levels: at the level of the organism, because adapted brain structures result from the control exercised on the organism by the environment, and at molecular and various neural levels because structures at these levels determine the behavior of the organism. Proust suggests a deep modification of Kim’s model of functional reduction and identification of mental properties with brain properties. Instead of considering static mental and physiological states or properties taken at an instant, it is only by interpreting functionalization dynamically that mind-brain reduction and identification becomes intelligible and is shown to be nomologically necessary. Whether “brain Darwinism” or “neural constructivism” will turn out to be the correct scientific account of the evolution of the brain, the conceptual framework of adaptive control systems promises a thorough understanding of how processes at many levels contribute essentially to the brain’s evolution.

The explanation of this development is mechanistic in Bechtel and Abrahamsen’s sense, and sheds light on the issue of the causal powers of the mental raised in Kim’s and Schlosser’s papers. Proust’s analysis justifies Dretske’s thesis that informational content is a structuring cause of behavior, and thus provides a reason to contest Schweizer’s claim that informational content can play no role in cognitive explanation of behavior. The paper presents only a sketch of the complex feedback mechanism underlying the brain’s evolving capacity to control the behavior of the organism in a way adapted to the environment. Inevitably, some questions remain open. Having explained that controlling states can only be understood in light of the information it is their function to carry, she adds that such controlling states both implement a command and represent that command. Is such a dual role necessary for mental representation? Another point that invites further development is this: Proust shows that the working of the control mechanism in its environment can only be adequately described by making reference to several levels. But in what sense of “level” does this show that there is “an intermediate level of reduction where functionalization and implementation coincide” (213)?


Bickle, J. (2003), Philosophy and Neuroscience: A Ruthlessly Reductive Account, Dordrecht, Kluwer.

Broad, C. D. (1925), The Mind and its Place in Nature, London, Harcourt, Brace and Co.; repr. London, Routledge, 2000.

Craver, C. F. & W. Bechtel (2007). Top-down Causation Without Top-down Causes. Biology and Philosophy, 22, 547-563.

Fisher, G. (1967), Measuring Ambiguity, The American Journal of Psychology, 80(4), p. 541-557.

Fodor J.A. (1987), Psychosemantics, Cambridge, MA, MIT Press.

Fodor J.A. (1994), The Elm and the Expert, Cambridge, MA, MIT Press.

Kim J. (1993), Supervenience and Mind, Cambridge, Cambridge UP.

Leitgeb, H. (2007), “Beliefs in Conditionals vs. Conditional Beliefs”, Topoi 26, p. 115-132.

Nagel E. (1961), The Structure of Science, London, Routledge and Kegan Paul.