Reductive Explanation in the Biological Sciences

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Marie I. Kaiser, Reductive Explanation in the Biological Sciences, Springer, 2015, 277pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319253084.

Reviewed by Ingo Brigandt, University of Alberta


Do we really need another discussion of reduction in biology? After all, arguments for reductionism and for anti-reductionism have led to a stalemate, and philosophical investigations have come to focus on the topic of epistemic integration. Fortunately, Marie I. Kaiser takes a step back and addresses the question of what an explanatory reduction is in the first place. Rather than maintaining either that reductionism is the ideal for biology or that it is futile, her notion of 'reduction' permits her to acknowledge that various explanations in biology are reductive, while many genuine biological explanations are not. The core questions guiding her discussion are: "What is reduction in biology? (in other words, Which important characteristics of actual cases of reduction can be identified?), and Where do the strengths and limitations of reduction in biological practice lie?" (p.6). These are fruitful philosophical questions. Kaiser also offers a metaphilosophical discussion of various degrees to which philosophy of science can be normative (rather than merely describing science). Developed based on many biological examples, her eventual account of explanatory reduction articulates three different characteristic features of a reductive explanation that permit her to compare and contrast reductive explanations with part-whole explanations and mechanistic explanations.

A very worthwhile feature of Kaiser's approach is that she starts out with a metaphilosophical account (Chapter 2), discussing the very philosophical method to be used in developing an account of explanatory reduction. To date, such considerations have for the most part been merely implicit in certain arguments for or against reductionism (the main exception possibly being Sarkar's 1998 tenet that an account of reduction should focus on substantive rather than formal issues). Moreover, beyond the specific context of reduction, Kaiser puts forward more general considerations -- very insightful ones -- about the different degrees to which a philosophy of science account can be normative rather than merely descriptive. In her case, she adopts what she calls a 'descriptive-critical' project that goes beyond mere description by including normative considerations about philosophical method ('methodological normativity'), but falls short of a normative project that lays out how science should look like and thus make normative claims about its object of study.

An important starting point for Kaiser is the desideratum to capture biological practice, in particular actual cases of reduction. Yet she argues that this cannot be achieved in a purely descriptive fashion, as the philosopher (i) needs to select relevant and paradigmatic cases of reduction, (ii) explicate assumptions that are merely implicit in biological practice, and (iii) provide coherence to the different and sometimes conflicting ideas of biologists. Consequently, to a criterion of descriptive adequacy, she adds the criterion of balancing specificity against generality by capturing the diversity of cases of reduction while also aiming at an account as coherent and general as possible. Finally, she includes what she calls 'norm-normativity', which is weaker than any attempt to offer an independent philosophical justification of some epistemic norm (e.g., Craver's 2007 suggestion of a justification for the norms of mechanistic explanation). Instead, her task is to clarify how "reductions contribute to or hinder the realization of relevant epistemic norms" (p.38), without justifying these norms, in this case the norm of providing explanatory success.

Well before putting forward her account of reduction, in Chapter 3 Kaiser draws lessons from previous debates about reductionism. This provides some grounding for those who are not familiar with the literature on reductionism. The lessons themselves are critical and focused enough to be of interest to reductionism-antireductionism debate addicts. The first lesson is to understand what reduction is before debating its possibility or impossibility (Kaiser acknowledges that some have previously conformed to this lesson, e.g., Sarkar 1998 and Hüttemann and Love 2011). The second lesson is that what matters most about reduction are epistemological considerations, given that this is the issue of concern to biologists. This contrasts with the focus on ontological issues in philosophy of mind. She also scrutinizes philosophers of biology who have endorsed a close connection between explanatory reduction and ontological reduction (e.g., Rosenberg 2006). The third lesson is to distinguish different types of reduction. In an interesting discussion of methodological reduction Kaiser explains why her project is about explanatory reduction rather than methodological reduction, and why interlevel reduction matters more than successional (diachronic) reduction. Potentially the most crucial lesson is that we need to move past Nagel's (1961) basic account of reduction. Two core assumptions of her revised construal of Nagel's approach that (she argues) still cannot be maintained are the idea that (i) the adequate units in a reduction are theories, and that (ii) the relation of reduction is logical derivation.

Chapter 4 assesses two basic philosophical frameworks. The first assumes that explanatory reduction is a relation between two explanations (a given explanation being reduced to a more fundamental one). According to the second framework an explanatory reduction is an individual explanation that explains some fact in a reductive fashion. As a proponent of the first framework, Kaiser discusses Alex Rosenberg's controversial 'Darwinian reductionism' (2006), which maintains that a biological explanation is adequate only if it is transformed into a molecular explanation. Although Rosenberg states that he wants to abandon Nagel's outdated model, Kaiser shows that he actually sticks to some (problematic) assumptions of Nagel's approach, for instance the assumption that laws carry the explanatory force in reductive explanations. In contrast to Kaiser's desideratum that reduction in actual biological practice ought to be philosophically captured, Rosenberg upholds an image of reduction that could only be maintained as an in principle ideal. Kaiser also argues that Rosenberg's view of explanation (presupposed by his account of reduction) is inadequate with respect to biological practice. Consequently, Kaiser favors the second framework that views explanatory reduction as individual reductive explanations. One previous proponent of it is Sahotra Sarkar (1998), yet beyond his focus on reductive explanations in molecular biology, Kaiser sets out to put forward a notion of explanatory reduction that captures non-molecular, yet genuine reductions in different biological fields. Another case in point is Andreas Hüttemann and Alan Love's (2011) account that discusses three different aspects of explanatory reduction: intrinsicality, fundamentality, and temporality (although Kaiser rightly argues that the latter is not a characteristic that may make an explanation reductive). An important point of theirs is that one should distinguish fundamentality (where an explanation appeals to more fundamental entities only) from intrinsicality (where an explanation appeals to the internal constitution of the phenomenon to be explained, but not its environment), given that a molecular explanation may meet fundamentality but fail to confirm to intrinsicality.

Kaiser's account of explanatory reduction, (in Chapter 5) focuses on three properties that an explanation may have: (1) a lower-level character, (2) an internal character, and (3) a parts-in-isolation character. Each of these three features are articulated in detail and assessed based on biological examples, where she ultimately views (1) and (3) as necessary conditions on reduction, while (2) is a typical feature of explanatory reduction, but not required for an explanation to qualify as reductive.

Lower-level character means that the explanation is in terms of lower-level features only, where she points out that such an explanation has a unidirectional flow from lower to higher level even if some of the lower-level entities invoked are not parts of/internal to the phenomenon to be explained. She also tackles the important question of when the functional properties and the organization of entities (that an explanation may invoke) are also lower-level features. And an example from community ecology illustrates that reductive explanation in terms of lower-level features that exist well beyond molecular (or lowest-level) explanations.

An explanation of a phenomenon or systems Y has an internal character if it appeals to features internal to Y, but not to surrounding factors. More precisely, environmental factors of Y do not have to be completely excluded, but they have to be conceptualized as mere background conditions or simplified as pure input or starting conditions. Still, by reusing Hüttemann and Love's (2011) example of protein folding, Kaiser shows that the common reductionistic strategy of explaining in terms of only internal factors can fail (as many instances of protein folding depend on chaperones outside of the protein to be folded).

According to Kaiser, a reductive explanation must have a parts-in-isolation character. This roughly means that the explanation must represent each part it invokes in isolation, but given that biological entities are never studied in complete isolation, she articulates 'in isolation' not as 'in isolation from any context' but as 'in isolation from the part's original (complex organismal) context'. Kaiser associates this parts-in-isolation character with the situation in which a system is near-decomposable, where -- given the system's relatively simple organization -- upon decomposition a part's actual functioning can be understood in isolation, and the whole system's operation can be recomposed from the parts interacting in a largely sequential and linear fashion (Bechtel and Richardson 2010).

Kaiser's distinction between the potential (1) lower-level character, (2) internal character, and (3) parts-in-isolation character of an explanation permits her to set apart some related, yet non-identical types of explanation. As already mentioned, she argues that a reductive explanation must have 1 and 3 (but not necessarily 2). On her account, a part-whole explanation has 1 and 2 (but not necessarily 3), and a mechanistic explanation has 2 (but not always 1 or 3).

That comparison makes sense and is quite useful. However, I would caution against Kaiser's idea of having delineated the best and only notion of reductive explanation, as evidenced, for example, by her central insistence that although reductive explanations in biology typically have an internal character, the true notion of reductive explanation does not require it. Biologists may very well call some explanations without an internal character 'reductive' (a fact on which Kaiser's approach can rely), but the diverse practice and use of a term across biology does not lend support to Kaiser's implicit philosophical agenda of delineating a unique meaning of a term. Likewise, Kaiser criticizes Hüttemann and Love (2011) for tending to identify part-whole and reductive explanations, and attributes this oversight to the fact that "Part-whole explanations are paradigmatic cases of reductive explanations" (p.237). Here Kaiser again appears to be capable of seeing past (merely?) paradigmatic cases of reduction at its real essence. Indeed, we can take a lesson from Hüttemann and Love's (2011) approach, because as opposed to putting forward a unique notion of reduction, they shift the philosophical aim toward laying out different aspects of reduction (intrinsicality, fundamentality, and temporality, in their case). My suggestion is to view the properties of lower-level character, internal character, and parts-in-isolation character to which Kaiser points in the same vein. The philosophical focus should be on these individual properties, as possessing (or not possessing) any of them has important consequences for a particular explanation. We may use different labels -- 'reductive explanation', 'part-whole explanation', 'mechanistic explanation' -- to distinguish different combinations of these properties, but these are better seen as convenient labels (adopted within our discourse) as opposed to authoritative accounts of some biological or philosophical notions that would trump other candidates.

My only serious misgiving about Kaiser's discussion is that she does not quite live up to her aim of investigating "the strengths and limitations of reduction in biological practice" (p.6). She implicitly addresses this question when (separately) articulating an explanation's potential lower-level character, internal character, and parts-in-isolation character, but once her final account of explanatory reduction is set up, she does not return to this core question even by way of summarizing some earlier points. And in the earlier discussion it is left up to the reader to realize that strengths and limitations are being mentioned. For instance, when developing the notion of an explanation's lower-level character, Kaiser mentions the unidirectional flow from lower to higher level. This can be seen as a strength of such an explanation. But it also offers a "possible line of criticism against reductive explanation" (p.194): if a reductive explanation does not permit a unidirectional flow, it can be seen as unable to capture some complex biological situations. Most importantly, these brief considerations do not amount to a detailed assessment of the strengths and limitations of either reductive explanation, or of explanation with a lower-level, an internal, or a parts-in-isolation character. Had Kaiser provided such a thorough assessment, she would have additionally highlighted the philosophical importance of these three properties of explanations.

In summary, based on many relevant biological examples, Reductive Explanation in the Biological Sciences offers a novel philosophical perspective on explanatory reduction by fruitfully distinguishing different important characteristics explanations may have. The account also excels by offering metaphilosophical reflections on normativity in philosophy of science.


Bechtel, W. and R. C. Richardson (2010) Discovering Complexity: Decomposition and Localization as Strategies in Scientific Research. MIT Press.

Craver, C. F. (2007) Explaining the Brain: Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience. Oxford University Press.

Hüttemann, A. and A. C. Love (2011) "Aspects of reductive explanation in biological science: intrinsicality, fundamentality, and temporality." British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 62: 519-549.

Nagel, E. (1961) The Structure of Science. Harcourt, Brace, and World.

Rosenberg, A. (2006) Darwinian Reductionism: Or, How to Stop Worrying and Love Molecular Biology. University of Chicago Press.

Sarkar, S. (1998) Genetics and Reductionism. Cambridge University Press.