Reexamining Deconstruction and Determinate Religion: Toward a Religion with Religion

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J. Aaron Simmons and Stephen Minister (eds.), Reexamining Deconstruction and Determinate Religion: Toward a Religion with Religion, Duquesne University Press, 2012, 409pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704579.

Reviewed by Neal DeRoo, Dordt College


Simmons and Minister gather some exciting young voices in Continental philosophy of religion to discuss the claim that postmodernism, and specifically deconstruction, pushes us to a renewed commitment to our own particular religious communities. They purposefully stage the book as a discussion: each of the first five chapters is followed by brief responses from two of the other contributors, and the last two chapters are sustained investigations of the ideas offered in the first five. Too often, calls for dialogue or to "respect the voice of the Other" are carried out, counter-intuitively, without any other voices being allowed into the work, so I commend the editors for being careful to avoid this performative contradiction in the structure of their book. Ultimately, this structure helps support the book's thesis that inhabiting a specific religious tradition does not prevent someone from engaging in actual, serious dialogue with other people.

The discussion is divided into three main section: Part One (chapters 1-2) argues for the importance of specific religious communities ("religion with religion") in postmodern philosophy of religion, in large part by arguing against some elements of the work of John D. Caputo and his "religion without religion"; Part Two (chapters 3-5) tries to give examples of how this "religion with religion" would work within specific religious communities by offering reinterpretations of some key elements of Christianity (faith, love, reading the Bible, and the 'kingdom of God'); and Part Three (chapters 6-7) provides a chance for some established scholars in the field -- Merold Westphal and John D. Caputo -- to critique this notion of "religion with religion" and situate it in relation to contemporary discussions in Continental philosophy of religion. I will look at each chapter briefly, before making some comments about the book overall, based largely on the interaction between Caputo and the editors that takes place in chapters 1, 2 and 7.

In chapter 1, J. Aaron Simmons argues that Caputo's religion without religion does not merely affirm that we cannot know, for sure, whether or not there is a God (what Simmons, following Westphal, refers to as "epistemological postmodernism"), but also asserts that there cannot be a God conceived as a personal being with superlative attributes: omniscience, omnipotence, etc. Since this latter view makes claims about the nature of (divine) reality, Simmons describes it as metaphysical, and claims that this notion of "metaphysical postmodernism" is inherently contradictory, and so must be abandoned. Once it is abandoned, only the epistemological option of postmodernism remains. It calls for a new kind of (postmodern) apologetics, conceived on a "dialogical and humble model" (57) that responds to "existential threats" (45) with "genuine conversation" (53) to show that Christianity is "something worth taking seriously" (58).

Stephen Minister also offers a critique of Caputo's religion without religion in chapter 2. He takes Caputo to task for refusing to concede that his religion without religion is yet another religion: weak theology, for Minister, is still a theology. Because he will not make this concession, Caputo is unable, according to Minister, to bring his own ethical and theological commitments "out in the open and expose them to the responses and criticism of others" (85). This is doubly problematic: first, it means that Caputo's a-theology and an-ethics are unclearly, and at times contradictorily, constructed, since attention is never paid to positively constructing them well; second, it means that, contrary to his own intentions, Caputo's a-theology and an-ethics in fact remain less respectful of the Other than they could (and should) be. Minister ends by drawing on Badiou, Levinas, and Mouffe to offer a more positively constructed account of a-theology and an-ethics, one that he finds "more logically consistent, descriptively accurate, and practically helpful" (110) than Caputo's.

Chapter 3 begins the second part of the book, "Religion with religion in practice." Here, Jeffrey Hanson offers an intriguing (and to this reader, at least, compelling) reading of Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling that is meant to counter the reading offered by Derrida in The Gift of Death. Hanson tries to show that central to Fear and Trembling is the idea that communication is about the transformation of a relationship. This fulcrum allows Hanson to significantly recast the understanding of silence at work in the text, which in turn enables him to recover some elements crucial to Kierkegaard that Derrida ignores (e.g., the distinction between divine and demonic silence, and an affirmation of the sacredness of all things for Abraham). Hanson's reading has the added merit of taking seriously those parts of the text that most interpreters of Fear and Trembling ignore: Problema III and the weaning narratives. While I find the chapter to be an excellent reading of Kierkegaard, its relation to the theme of the volume is not obvious: how does it contribute to a renewed understanding of religion with religion? This was not clear to me (nor to some of the other contributors in the book; see, for example, Westphal's remarks on 259).

The next two chapters, for me, represent the highlights of the volume. In chapter four, Drew Dalton offers an enlightening reinterpretation of the role of love in the Christian religion. Drawing heavily on Plato and Levinas, he not only clarifies the relationship between eros and agape, but then moves to show that this newly clarified account of love is phenomenologically identifiable as an active reality in the life of the subject. Agapic love, then, issues in a command of "active commitment to an agapic service of the Other" that must function, Dalton argues, as "the real core of any such religion with religion" (196).

In chapter five, Bruce Ellis Benson offers an extended meditation on what it means to be "not far from the kingdom" (see Mark 12:34). He shows that, over the course of the gospels, Jesus offers at least four very different answers to the question of what one must do to be saved: 1) be born again (see John 3); 2) have friends with sufficient faith (Mark 2:5); 3) sell everything you own and give it to those in need (Luke 14:33); and 4) give away half of what you own (Luke 19:1-10). As if this were not confusing enough, within each of these answers there is significant ambiguity about what, precisely, is being said or prescribed. These confusions may not be accidental, but may indicate something essential about the life of following Jesus: such a life is a life of disruption, because the logic of Jesus' kingdom does not fit the logic of this world, but rather provides "intimations of a new kind of human existence" (227).

Finally, the book ends with two sustained reflections on its content thus far. In chapter 6, Westphal, with his trademark honesty and clarity, reflects on each of the preceding five chapters (both the original chapter and the two responses by other contributors to that chapter). He raises concerns and questions, while ultimately affirming much of what the book is arguing for. The chapter provides a model of how to engage seriously with the work of another, and how meaningful genuine dialogue can be.

Chapter 7 is left for John D. Caputo, the proponent of "religion without religion" and the target of criticism by some of the contributors. Caputo's engagement in this chapter is limited to the first two chapters, those written by Simmons and Minister, since these are the two that deal most directly with his work. What results is a restatement of his project that re-covers a lot of ground that has already been covered elsewhere, but he does it here more clearly and more directly. Most significantly for the purposes of this volume, he makes clear that he affirms the "without" (of religion without religion) as a with/out, as both with and without.[1] As such, the tension that seems to animate the introduction and first part of the book -- that between deconstruction and determinate religions -- is revealed as an apparent tension only: religion without religion was never a religion without content.

So why has it so often been accused of being precisely that: religion without content? In saying that "the truth of [a] religious tradition is not deposited in assertions, in propositional truths" but rather "is found in a more underlying 'way' . . . a 'world' . . . a certain world-disclosure, a form of life" (277-278), Caputo might seem to advocate a religion without any assertions, without any content. However, downplaying assertions is not equivalent to eliminating them. Rather, Caputo attempts to situate those assertions within a larger horizon, a form of life, which will certainly have epistemological implications, but cannot merely be reduced to those implications, and cannot, therefore, be evaluated merely by epistemological criteria. The truth of religious life is not evaluated by way of a "zero-sum" game of "correctness," where my claim can be representationally accurate only when yours is representationally inaccurate (348-349). Rather, as a 'way of life,' the truth of religion is verified in its vitality, not its correctness -- and there is more than one way for people to live vital lives. In this regard, religious life is more like cultural life than like a true/false exam: there can be many different cultures without the truth of one making the others false.

Of course, religion, as a way of life, pertains also to epistemological life, and so makes representational claims that can be considered as accurate or inaccurate. Caputo does not deny this (349-350), he merely tries to downplay its significance for religion. In that way, his work is a "second-order discourse," a discourse about how particular religions (first-order discourses) ought to think about what religion is all about (i.e., it is about a 'way of life,' not facts about the world). Simmons and Minister seem to claim that Caputo's second-order discourse leaves no room for making exclusive, epistemological claims in first-order discourses. A religious way of life, they argue, would be quite bizarre if that life could not include claims to representational accuracy. To answer these concerns, Caputo's arguments would have to elaborate more clearly (and more consistently) precisely how a religious 'way of life' manifests itself epistemologically. This would include detailing both: a) a genetic account of how the 'event' of religion is concretized epistemologically; and b) the role epistemological concerns ought to play in a 'weak' religion.

By engaging only with the two chapters that emphasize most strongly the propositional notion of truth, Caputo is able to clearly drive home the differences between his view and a more 'orthodox' account of religion. While there is certainly merit in highlighting this difference, it would have been nice for Caputo to also engage significantly with one of the other works in the book that adopted a notion of truth more in line with what he is advocating. If nothing else, doing so would have helped him argue that abandoning the epistemological understanding of religious truth need not entail abandoning one's religious tradition. Both Dalton and Benson, it seems to me, make suggestions similar to Caputo's, but do so from positions clearly within a particular religious tradition. Both give an account, internal to Christianity (especially in Benson's case), that claims that the essence of Christianity is not found in affirming certain propositions as true but in taking up one's life in a particular way -- by being committed to agapically serving others (Dalton) or by being opened onto the new kind of human existence that Jesus calls for (Benson). Had Caputo engaged more meaningfully with one of these chapters, we might have been able to crystallize more clearly what is at stake in the debate between religion with religion and religion without religion.

As it is, I admit to having difficulty clarifying what, precisely, is the difference between religion with religion and religion without religion. I find it telling that both Dalton and Benson here offer versions of religion with religion that seem to be very similar to things Caputo himself could have written, as Westphal notices in his commentary on the chapters (264, 266). If true religion "must be asserted in love, confessed in deed, and disclosed in action," as Dalton argues (197), is this religion with or without religion? When the rubber hits the road, and religion with religion is put into practice in this volume, it does not seem to be significantly different than religion without religion. In fact, I'm not sure whether religion with religion is anything other than a religion without religion that does not want to lose focus on the 'with' side of the slash. As such, I do not immediately see how this volume offers an alternative to religion without religion "from within deconstruction and phenomenology" (5): it is either just religion (that has not made the deconstructive turn) or it is religion with/out religion. It is certainly not the intent of the editors that it be the former, and the latter is the position of both Caputo and Derrida. Rather than an alternative, perhaps it is better to say that this call for religion with religion offers a good reminder to keep the balance of the slash in the with/out (a balance that, perhaps, Caputo's work does not always adequately strike). More importantly, Dalton and Benson remind us why this is a balance worth striking.

[1] This is not new, but echoes his interactions with the contributors to an earlier volume dedicated to his work; James H. Olthuis (ed.), Religion with/out Religion: The Prayers and Tears of John D. Caputo (New York: Routledge, 2001).