Reexamining the Quantum-Classical Relation: Beyond Reductionism and Pluralism

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Alisa Bokulich, Reexamining the Quantum-Classical Relation: Beyond Reductionism and Pluralism, Cambridge UP, 2008, 195pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521857208.

Reviewed by N.P. Landsman, Radboud University Nijmegen



Alisa Bokulich’s first book is concerned with the relationship between classical and quantum mechanics as a special case of the general problem of theory reduction (or, more generally, of intertheory relations). Thus it may be located at the interface of the philosophy of modern physics and the general philosophy of science, but it is an unusual contribution to both. First, the mainstream and overwhelming majority of philosophical literature on quantum physics deals with one or more of the following (interconnected) topics: locality and the Bell inequalities, the measurement problem, interpretations of quantum mechanics, Bohmian mechanics (a separate subculture in the philosophy of physics that is nonetheless closely related to the other topics), and, more recently, decoherence. Bokulich manages to avoid all of these topics, despite the fact that writers on all but the first, and particularly on the last (Schlosshauer, 2007) see the connection between classical and quantum mechanics as one of their main concerns. Perhaps this is possible because, whereas the mainstream ultimately addresses physics problems (though from a foundational point of view), Bokulich works squarely within the general philosophy of science. But, and this is the second aspect in which she is unusual, here again a wide gap separates her from the mainstream. She dismisses all known accounts of intertheory relations – including a recent one based on structuralism — as irrelevant or inappropriate to the quantum-classical relation, and will make few friends with remarks like

In sum, while the partial structure approach has the virtues of precision and generality, it is not clear to me that this abstract formalism has in fact given us any real purchase on the concrete debates in the philosophy of science that motivated it in the first place (pp. 169-170)


Contemporary philosophy of science has for too long been dominated by what we might call the Heisenberg-Kuhn tradition, which views theories such as quantum mechanics as having made a radical break with their predecessors. (p. 174)

Hence at the very least one might say that this is a courageous book. More importantly, it is also a very interesting one, and my personal opinion is that Bokulich is typically right whenever she is controversial. This opinion is fed not only by the frequent strength of her arguments, but also by my impression that, as far as 20th century philosophers — as opposed to scientists like Einstein and Bohr — have set its agenda, the philosophy of science has become separated from the actual science it is supposed to describe by a wide gap. Consequently, scientists rarely take notice of its introverted debates. Through her choice of themes, supported by philosophical background information for physicists as well as essential physics knowledge for philosophers, Bokulich’s book obviously attempts to bridge this gap. And successfully so, I would say.

Despite its originality, Reexamining the Quantum-Classical Relation does have a few predecessors. Batterman (2001), concerned with “asymptotic reasoning” as a special case of an intertheory relation, was clearly a source of inspiration to Bokulich. He shares a critical attitude towards known mechanisms for explanation and theory reduction, and is at the same time broader and narrower: broader in that it examines a number of other examples of intertheory relations beyond the classical-quantum interface (like critical phenomena in statistical mechanics and wave optics versus geometric optics), and narrower in the sense that Batterman’s discussion of the first topic is much shorter and less complete. Scheibe (1997, 1999), on the other hand, is an encyclopedic treatise of theory reduction in physics that is unfortunately not cited by Bokulich, possibly because it is in German and has not been translated so far (where are the days in which Anglosaxon philosophers knew at least German, Latin and Greek?). Die Reduktion Physikalischer Theorien is, in my opinion, a work of exceptional quality, written at the end of Scheibe’s long and distinguished career, which no author on intertheory relations in physics can really afford to ignore. However, perhaps surprisingly and in any case fortunately, it only mildly overlaps with the book under review (see below for more detailed comments).

Both Bokulich and Scheibe review earlier literature on intertheory relations originating with philosophers as well as with physicists (whose views often preceded those of the philosophers). Broadly speaking, one finds the two extreme opposites of reductionism and pluralism represented in both groups, physicists and traditional 20th century philosophers tending towards the former, and contemporary philosophers (in the wake of P. Feyerabend and more recently N. Cartwright) towards the latter. Technically, Scheibe, Batterman, and Bokulich all find traditional philosophical accounts of intertheory relations (originally going back to C. Hempel, E. Nagel, J. Kemeny & P. Oppenheim, P. Oppenheim & H. Putnam, and T. Nickles) wanting; Bokulich in addition dismisses more recent formal approaches due to O. Bueno, S. French, J. Ladyman, and others. The reason for this negative attitude, which I share, is quite straightforward: the formal accounts that have been proposed by such philosophers apply to few if any actual physical theories, and are certainly irrelevant to the relationship between classical and quantum mechanics (see also by my earlier quotation from pp. 169-170 of Bolkulich’s book). Positively speaking, this situation entices at least Scheibe and Bokulich (and hence their readers) to take a more serious look at the physics literature on intertheory relations.

Here Scheibe takes an earlier start, namely with Boltzmann and Planck, subsequently moving on to Einstein and Heisenberg, whereas Bokulich almost exclusively deals with Bohr, Heisenberg, and Dirac. The last of these tends to be ignored in the philosophy of physics literature (including Scheibe) — many would even say that Dirac lacked a philosophy altogether — but in Bokulich’s book he slowly but decisively emerges as her unsung hero. Also, bizarrely, in the Anglosaxon literature it turns out to be strikingly original to take Heisenberg seriously as a philosopher; whereas in the German-language literature he has been one of the most influential philosophical thinkers about quantum theory from the beginning, until very recently English-language philosophers at best put him down as a naive positivist (and at worst as a war criminal). This seems to be changing gradually; we now have excellent recent PhD theses by Frappier (2004) and Camilleri (2009) on Heisenberg’s philosophy of physics, and, of course, the book under review.

Indeed, the sharp contrast between Heisenberg’s and Dirac’s views on the nature of theory succession, particularly on the relationship between classical and quantum mechanics, is the main thread running through Bokulich’s book. Although Heisenberg’s famous 1925 paper, undoubtedly under the influence of Bohr, still introduces quantum mechanics as an Umdeutung (i.e. reinterpretation) of classical mechanics, from 1927 onwards he began to regard both classical and quantum mechanics (and also Maxwell’s electrodynamics) as “closed theories”. This means that even small modifications (i.e., those not involving a change in the conceptual structure) to these theories would be fatal to their consistency, and that they provide perfect descriptions of their domain of applicability (as Scheibe [1997, pp. 20-21] points out, Einstein saw his own theory of general relativity in much the same way). This appears to be a pluralist view if there has ever been one, resonating well, of course, with Kuhn, whose fascinating discussions with Heisenberg in 1963 Bokulich reports on in some detail.

Dirac, on the other hand, emphasized the structural continuity of quantum mechanics with respect to its classical predecessor right from the beginning. In 1926 he was the first to recognize that the commutator of two observables in quantum mechanics — seen by Heisenberg and others as the revolutionary aspect of the theory — has a perfect classical analogue, namely the Poisson bracket, and more generally he always regarded quantum mechanics as an extension of classical mechanics, rather than as a break with it. Furthermore, he believed quantum mechanics and especially quantum field theory to be subject to future change, like all scientific theories, which is a far cry from Heisenberg’s (and, more recently, S. Weinberg’s) claim of finality.

Bokulich has an interesting and original reason for favoring Dirac’s attitude over Heisenberg’s. This reason, whose exposition is another major theme in the book, is the unexpected success of what is called the semiclassical approximation to quantum theory.

Here one should distinguish two issues. One is the approximation of classical mechanics by quantum mechanics, the goal of which is the explanation of (the appearance of) the classical world from quantum theory. Crucial as it is for the problem of theory reduction, this subject would have fitted within the overall theme of Bokulich’s book — it is indeed a major portion of Scheibe (1999) — but, apart from a few cursory remarks, she hardly treats it; see Landsman (2007) for a recent survey addressed to philosophers of physics. The other is the approximation of quantum mechanics by classical mechanics, which attempts to use as much information as possible about a given classical system in order to solve, say, the Schrödinger equation of the corresponding quantum system. This is the theme that Bokulich calls to the attention of philosophers. It goes back to Bohr himself, who, in the renowned 1913 theory of the atom named after him, computed atomic spectra from information about the classical electronic orbits, supplemented by “quantization conditions”. His approach was refined in 1917 in a relatively little studied paper by Einstein. In 1926, almost immediately after the birth of quantum mechanics, the well-known WKB-approximation appeared (named after G. Wentzel, H. Kramers, and L. Brillouin) which in the 1950s was improved by J. Keller, V. Maslov, and others. In 1971, the Gutzwiller trace formula appeared, which, unlike the earlier methods (which only applied to integrable systems), also put chaotic systems under the umbrella of semiclassical approximation techniques. Since then, the relevance of such techniques has only increased; what these have in common is that some purely quantum-mechanical phenomenon may successfully be computed or parametrized on the basis of classical data.

As Bokulich notices, this unexpected success poses a problem to philosophers of science interested in explanation, as well as to those trying to understand intertheory relations. As to the former, given that quantum particles/wave functions simply do not have classical orbits and the like, how can these obviously fictitious entities nonetheless be understood to play an explanatory role in quantum theory? (Let me point out that the same problem occurs in quantum field theory, in which practically all perturbative computations to date are based on the Feynman diagram technique: such diagrams are visualized as virtual particles running forward and backward in time, clearly fictitious entities comparable to the classical orbits etc. discussed by Bokulich). As to the latter, what does the apparent validity of semiclassical approximations mean for the relationship between classical and quantum mechanics?

These are difficult questions. In an effort to answer them, Bokulich suggests that the explanatory role of classical data in quantum theory may be understood in the sense of a “structural model explanation”, a notion developed by P. Railton, R. Hughes, R. Clifton, and others:

Very broadly, a structural explanation is one in which the explanandum is explained by showing how the (typically mathematical) structure of the theory itself limits what sort of objects, properties, states, or behaviors are admissible within the framework of that theory, and then showing that the explanandum is in fact a consequence of that structure. (p. 149)

Furthermore, quoting Clifton, structural explanations ‘need not be underpinned by causal stories and may make essential reference to purely mathematical structures that display the similarity and connections between phenomena’ (p. 150). In this sense, Bokulich concludes, ‘classical trajectories — even though they are fictions — can genuinely explain the morphology of quantum wave functions’ (p. 150). Addressing the second question in my previous paragraph, Bokulich proposes a view she calls “interstructuralism”. This is

an approach to intertheory relations that emphasizes the importance of structural continuities and correspondences in giving an adequate account of the relation between two theories… . Applied to the case of classical and quantum mechanics, interstructuralism says that the relation between these theories consists in the fact that they to a large extent share the same dynamical structures, where that continuity of structure can be characterized by a number of different correspondence relations or correspondence principles. To say that an interstructuralist relation holds between two theories means that there is a close formal analogy between the two theories, which can provide the basis for a heuristic methodology of the sort described by Dirac. (p. 173)

Short of providing philosophical analysis of a certain scientific practice, such answers appear to me merely to present an abstract descriptive account of that practice. Nonetheless, Bokulich has brought the question: ‘What is the relation between classical and quantum mechanics?’ (p. 1) to a new level — especially within the philosophical context of intertheory relations. Readable, relevant, and provocative to both philosophers of science and physicists, Reexamining the Quantum-Classical Relation is an important book.


Batterman, R. W. 2001, The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction and Emergence, Oxford: Oxford UP.

Camilleri, K. 2009, Heisenberg and the Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics: The Physicist as Philosopher, Cambridge: Cambridge UP.

Frappier, M. 2004. Heisenberg’s Notion of Interpretation, PhD Thesis, U of Western Ontario, unpublished.

Landsman, N.P. 2007, Between classical and quantum, Handbook of the Philosophy of Science Vol. 2: Philosophy of Physics, eds. J. Butterfield and J. Earman, Part A, pp. 417-554, Amsterdam: North-Holland, Elsevier.

Scheibe, E. 1997, Die Reduktion Physikalischer Theorien: Ein Beitrag zur Einheit der Physik. Teil I: Grundlagen und elementare Theorie, Berlin: Springer-Verlag.

Scheibe, E. 1999, Die Reduktion Physikalischer Theorien: Ein Beitrag zur Einheit der Physik. Teil II: Inkommensurabilität und Grenzfallreduktion, Berlin: Springer-Verlag.

Schlosshauer, M. 2007, Decoherence and the Quantum-To-Classical Transition, Berlin: Springer-Verlag.