Reference and Description: The Case Against Two-Dimensionalism

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Scott Soames, Reference and Description: The Case Against Two-Dimensionalism, Princeton University Press, 2005, 384pp, $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 0691121001

Reviewed by Eros Corazza, Carleton University


In this dense, eleven-chapter book Soames' aim is to propose a devastating criticism of two-dimensionalism, whose main proponents are Stalnaker, Jackson, and Chalmers. The two-dimensionalist' sin is the resurrection of the descriptivist picture (and the Fregean Sinn), i.e. the very picture which came under attack by so-called direct reference theorists (Kripke, Kaplan, Donnellan, Perry, Putnam, Marcus, etc.). According to the descriptivist picture popularized by the works of Frege and Russell, a word relates to its referent via a description (or set of descriptions) uniquely identifying it. Thus, London stands for London because it is associated with a description or cluster of descriptions -- e.g. the capital of England, the UK's most populous city, the city inhabited by the Queen of England, … -- which uniquely stand(s) for London. A speaker understands a sentence containing London insofar as she associates the relevant description(s) to it.

The criticisms of the traditional descriptivist picture are well known, and, as Soames shows, they can be grouped under two main headings: (i) the modal arguments and (ii) the epistemic arguments.

Kripke has been the chief exponent of the modal argument. It runs as follows: if a term n (a proper name, a count noun, a mass term, …) relates to its referent/extension because of its association with a description(s), say D, then n could not have existed without being D. There are, though, countless counterfactual situations (or possible worlds) in which n is not D. Hence, being D is not a necessary condition of n. Einstein could have existed without doing anything that we commonly attribute to him. It is not, for instance, a necessary truth that Einstein discovered the theory of relativity. Einstein would refer to Einstein even if he weren't the discoverer of the theory of relativity. Furthermore, Einstein wouldn't cease to refer to Einstein even if turns out that the theory of relativity was discovered by Smith. Einstein is a rigid designator designating Einstein in all possible worlds in which Einstein exists, regardless of the description(s) one associates to it in our or these possible worlds.

The epistemic argument can be summarized as follows. Descriptivism holds that the semantic content of n is the same as the semantic content of D -- they contribute the same content to the proposition expressed. Hence, given that n is F expresses the same proposition as D is F, if one knows that n is F, one also knows that D is F, for the attributions Jon knows that n is F and Jon knows that D is F relate Jon with the very same proposition, i.e. that n/D is F. Furthermore, since the proposition expressed by If n exists, then n is D is the same proposition as the one expressed by If D exists, then D is D, the former, like the latter, is knowable a priori. The claim It is knowable a priori that if n exists, then n is D is, therefore, true. But one may competently use Einstein and water without knowing that Einstein is the discoverer of the theory of relativity or that water is H2O. The microstructure of water, i.e. H2O, was discovered well after people began using the term water. Thus, it is simply not true that one can know a priori that water is H2O or that Einstein discovered the theory of relativity.

The general moral seems to be, pace Frege and Russell, that the meaning of a term -- be it a proper name, a mass term, a count noun, … -- is not given by the description(s) that speakers associate with it.

To escape the modal argument, the descriptivist strategy is to rigidify the relevant description(s) usually associated with n. This can be done in using either actual or Kaplan's Dthat (the latter should be understood as a demonstrative surrogate). Both actual and Dthat make a description a rigid designator. Thus names, mass terms, count nouns, etc. are synonymous with rigidified descriptions. Einstein is synonymous with something like the actual discoverer of the theory of relativity or Dthat[the discoverer of the theory of relativity] -- they both pick out the same individual in all possible worlds in which he exists -- while water is synonymous with Dthat[the watery stuff of our acquaintance]. This should capture the fact that a competent speaker using Einstein or water knows that the former stands for the discoverer of the theory of relativity, while the latter stands for the watery stuff we are acquainted with, i.e. what fills our lakes, bath tubs, Evian bottles, etc.

The advantages of descriptivism are clear. As Soames points out, the friends of two-dimensionalism propose an elegant solution to the well-known Fregean cognitive significance puzzle. Since one associates different descriptions with coreferential terms, say Tully and Cicero or Superman and Clark Kent, they do not have the same cognitive value. When one comes to accept that Tully is Cicero, one expands one's knowledge. Secondly, descriptivism also aims to deal with the non-substitution of coreferring or coextensive expressions embedded in attitude ascriptions, i.e. when they appear in attributions of the form Jane believes/thinks/knows/ that Tully is Roman.

Yet, the friends of descriptivism do not want to deny the substitution of coreferring/coextensive expressions appearing in modal construals. Thus, It is necessary/possible that Tully is F is equivalent with It is necessary/possible that Cicero is F, while It is necessary that water is H20 is equivalent with It is necessary that Dthat[the watery stuff of our acquaintance] is H20.

Kripke told us that an identity like Water is H20 is an instance of the necessary a posteriori, i.e., although it is metaphysically necessary it cannot be known a priori. It is thus epistemologically a posteriori. The friends of two-dimensionalism deal with the necessary a posteriori by distinguishing between primary and secondary intensions such that every sentence is associated with two propositions. Primary and secondary intensions are reminiscent of Kaplan's content/character distinction. The primary intension comes close to Kaplan's character while the secondary intension comes close to Kaplan's content. Thus, a sentence's primary intension is a proposition which is true with respect to all and only those contexts C to which the Kaplanian character of the sentence assigns a proposition which is true at C. The secondary intension (or proposition expressed) of a sentence at a context C is the proposition assigned by the character of the sentence to C. When sentences don't contain indexicals the primary and secondary intensions coincide. On the other hand, the primary and secondary intensions of a sentence containing indexicals can differ insofar as the former is constant and invariant while the latter can vary from context to context. Necessary a posteriori sentences are the ones whose secondary intensions are necessary, while their characters assign false propositions to some contexts. Water is H20 is necessary insofar as there is no context (or possible world) in which water is not H20. Yet it is not a priori insofar as the character of Water is H20 assigns false propositions in some contexts (or possible worlds).

Be that as it may, two-dimensionalism rests on what we could call indexical-descriptivism. According to this view proper names, mass terms, and the like are synonymous with indexical descriptions. Thus, if a noun phrase NP is a proper name, a mass term, a count noun, … , then it can be analyzed as Dthat[D], where D is a description a competent speaker associates with the relevant NP. These NPs are thus analyzed as complex demonstratives of the sort This/that D -- remember that Kaplan's Dthat must be understood as a demonstrative surrogate -- and would thus be treated as indexicals. Is this, thus, the right analysis? That is, are mass terms like water or proper names like Paris and Saul Kripke disguised indexicals? If proper names are treated as indexicals then they should have a character directing to some aspect of context. In particular, proper names, like indexicals, should have a linguistic meaning (character) understood as a function taking as its argument the context and giving as its value the referent. Furthermore, like the character of an indexical, the character of a proper name should be viewed as a rule which one needs to master in order to use an indexical correctly. One cannot competently use I if one does not know that it refers to the agent (roughly the utterer or writer), just as one cannot competently use this pen when one does not know that an utterance of it refers to the demonstrated pen. Do proper names and mass terms behave according to this model? If this were the case we would blur the important distinction between presemantic and semantic use of context. (See J. Perry, "Indexicals and Demonstratives", in R. Hale & C. Wright (eds.), Companion to the Philosophy of Language, B. Blackwell(1997), 586-612, p. 593); see also Kaplan's distinction between foundational semantics and meta-semantics , "Afterthoughts", in J. Almog, J. Perry, and H. Wettstein (eds.) Themes from Kaplan, Oxford University Press (1989), 565-614, p. 573-4). This semantic/presemantic use of context distinction captures the fact that when using proper names, mass terms and the like, context is in play before the name is used: we first fix the context and then use the name, while with indexical expressions context is at work the very moment we use them. As Perry suggests, we often use context to disambiguate a mark or noise (e.g. 'bank' or 'Socrates' used either as a tag for the philosopher or for the Brazilian football player). These are presemantic uses of context. With indexicals, though, context is used semantically. It remains relevant after the language, words and meaning are all known; the meaning directs us to certain aspects of context. This distinction reflects the fact that proper names, mass terms, etc., unlike indexicals, contribute to building context-free (eternal) sentences, that is, sentences which are true or false independently of the context in which they are used.

To summarize, Soames' book can be considered as another (big) nail in the descriptivists' coffin. It thus come as a bit of a surprise to see that Soames himself somewhat appeals to descriptivism when suggesting how anti-descriptivists should deal with Frege-inspired puzzles. Soames' strategy consists in arguing that when one uses a proper name n "one gets the result that the proposition semantically expressed by n is F is the bare singular proposition that simply predicates the property expressed by F of the referent o of n. However, assertive utterances of this sentence may result in the assertion not only of this proposition, but also of propositions that include additional descriptive information. In many contexts, an agent who assertively utters n is F asserts the descriptively enriched proposition expressed by The x: [Dx and x=y] is F, with respect to an assignment of the referent o of n to 'y', where D is a predicate contextually associated with 'n' by speaker and hearer" (p. 348).

Soames' book is, no doubt, a great addition to the literature on descriptivism in particular and philosophy of language and mind in general. To my knowledge it constitutes the major criticism of two-dimensionalism on the market. Soames' arguments against the two-dimensionalist picture are persuasive and convincing. Descriptivism, no matter how one rephrases it, seems to be a dead end. The ball is now in the camp of the defenders of the descriptivist picture and particularly in the camp of the friends of two-dimensionalism. It is now up to them to prove that Soames' arguments don't make the whole two-dimensionalist building crumble.