Reference and Existence: The John Locke Lectures

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Saul A. Kripke, Reference and Existence: The John Locke Lectures, Oxford University Press, 2013, 170pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199928385.

Reviewed by Stuart Brock, Victoria University of Wellington


This book is destined to become a philosophical classic, something it already should be. It is the published version of his John Locke Lectures, delivered in 1973. Here, Kripke explores and develops themes from Naming and Necessity (NN), applying ideas from that work to discussions of fictional and mythological discourse, the metaphysics of fictional and non-existent objects, negative existentials, and other related matters. The lectures have been relatively inaccessible for the last forty years -- a single transcript was available from the University of Oxford library -- and so now, for the first time, the lectures will receive the attention and recognition they deserve. Kripke, quite sensibly, decided to make only minor revisions to the original manuscript, so that "the final text remains faithful to the lectures as they were delivered" (x). The monograph is full of philosophical insights. It clearly presents an exciting and original picture of fictional objects and the semantics of fictional discourse. Anyone who knows the literature in this area well will marvel at the influence Kripke has had on the field; anyone new to these discussions couldn't find a clearer or more in-depth discussion of the main issues. This is Kripke at his best!

Lecture I contrasts Kripke's preferred view of proper names with descriptivist theories. The picture Kripke defends in Lecture I (and in more detail in NN) is (i) that proper names in natural language are rigid designators, and (ii) that names refer because there is a causal chain that links tokens of the name to other tokens of the name, and the chain extends back to an initial baptism. Lecture I introduces and discusses the problem of empty or non-referring names. Kripke shows why it is a particularly pressing problem for Millian theories and how Russell and Frege attempt to solve the problem. Controversially, though, he suggests that "the existence of fiction is a powerful argument for absolutely nothing: it cannot settle the question as between the Russellian theory and the Millian theory . . . and any other theory" (23). The reason is that fiction and storytelling involves pretence rather than assertion. When reading a work of fiction, Kripke tells us, one should pretend that what is explicitly stated in the fiction is true, including any specified criteria for naming (Millian, Russellian, or whatever).

Far from it being the case that a theory of the reference [and meaning] of names ought to make special provision for the possibility of such works of fiction, it can forget about this case, and then simply remark that, in a work of fiction, it is part of the pretense of that work of fiction that these criteria are satisfied. (23-24)

According to Kripke, then, fictional discourse involves pretence. When we engage in this kind of discourse, we pretend to assert propositions, often using names that we pretend have a specified reference and semantic value.

In Lecture II Kripke develops arguments from NN against descriptivist treatments of fictional terms. In particular, he suggests that: (i) rarely (if ever) does a fiction associate enough descriptive content with a fictional name to uniquely identify any possible or actual individual; (ii) if the descriptive content accidentally picked out a unique individual, it would not thereby be the fictional character; and (iii) Russell and Frege falsely claim that if there is no individual that uniquely fits the relevant descriptive content of a name N in a story, then 'N does not exist' is true. In this lecture, Kripke puts forward an extended modal argument against descriptivist theories of fictional names, suggesting that statements like 'Moses might not have existed' pose a pressing worry for Russell and Frege that cannot be resolved by appealing to scope ambiguities. He also elaborates on cryptically brief statements in NN, explaining why he now thinks statements like 'Sherlock Holmes does not exist but he might have' are not true. He spends some time explaining why the same considerations can be applied to terms like 'unicorn' and 'dragon'.

Lecture III is perhaps the most important of the series. In it we see the very first well developed articulation of artifactualism, as well as the first arguments in support of it. Artifactualism is the view that fictional characters are actually existing abstract individuals; they are created and sustained by human beings. On this view, although a fictional character is abstract, it is a social entity, "which exists in virtue of more concrete activities the same way that a nation is an abstract entity which exists in virtue of concrete relations between people" (73). Artifactualism is perhaps the received view today and is certainly the most widely accepted form of realism. But it wasn't in 1973 when Kripke presented these lectures. Moreover, Kripke's version of artifactualism is at least as sophisticated as the version defended by others, and his arguments are potentially more interesting.

Kripke, like van Inwagen (1977), distinguishes carefully between two different kinds of predication, and claims that "One will get quite confused if one doesn't get these two different kinds of predications straight" (75). To illustrate the two varieties of predication, Kripke considers the following two statements, both of which are true:

1. Hamlet is a fictional character

2. Hamlet was melancholy

Each statement predicates some property of Hamlet, but these

two predicates should be taken in different senses. The second predicate, 'is melancholy,' has attached to it the implicit qualifier fictionally, or in the story. Whereas of course the first [predicate] . . . does not have this implicit qualifier. . . . Using predicates according to their use in fiction -- that is, according to the rule which applies a predicate to a fictional character if that fictional character is so described in the appropriate work of fiction -- we should conclude that Hamlet was not a fictional character. (74)

Kripke doesn't explain why he thinks statement (2) involves a special kind of predication, rather than taking it, unlike (1), as involving ellipsis (that is, as containing a hidden fictional operator). Treating (2), and statements like it, as involving a special kind of predication, though, means that Kripke's view is very similar to van Inwagen's. (Van Inwagen 1977 maintains that exemplification and ascription are two very different kinds of predication; that statements like (1) claim that Hamlet has or exemplifies the property of being a fictional character, whereas statements like (2) merely ascribe the property of being melancholy to Hamlet.) The first statement, suggests Kripke, is obviously true and yet contains no implicit qualification. Kripke considers in detail a variety of different kinds of statements apparently about fictional characters -- simple subject-predicate statements like (1), quantificational statements such as 'Large numbers of people in English fiction have been in love,' and relational statements like 'This literary critic admires Desdemona, and despises Iago.' Careful consideration of these kinds of examples leads Kripke to conclude that ordinary language speakers are committed to the existence of fictional characters.

Lectures IV and V and the first part of Lecture VI, while facinating, show the most sign of their age. They are most likely to be of interest to those curious about the history of ideas, but for different reasons. Lecture IV is an extension of the considerations in Lecture III, used to illuminate and help adjudicate a debate between Austin and Ayer on the philosophy of perception. That debate raged in the late 1950s and through to the early 1960s. Lecture V and the first part of Lecture VI give us the first outing of the material in Kripke's jusifiably famous 'Speaker's Reference and Semantic Reference,' first published in 1977. It is interesting to see how much of the material in the 1977 paper was already contained in the John Locke Lectures. (To ascertain just how similar the lectures are, though, the serious historian will need to access the unedited manuscript from the University of Oxford library.)

The second longer and more important part of Lecture VI (144-160) addresses the problem of negative existentials; for the first time we see Kripke facing the problem directly and head on. Ultimately the solution he offers is not entirely satisfactory. Kripke himself expresses some reservations about the proposal, but only because it is "a complicated and messy view" (159). I think the problem for Kripke is even more pressing than Kripke himself makes out, and I will explain why in the final paragraphs of this review.

Consider the following statement.

3. Hamlet does not exist

The problem for Kripke, and other artifactualists, is to explain why we have the firm intuition that negative existentials like (3) are true, and to explain those intuitions away. If 'Hamlet' is an empty name, then (3) looks as though it expresses no proposition at all, let alone a true one. If artifactualism is true, and 'Hamlet' refers to an abstract artifact, then (3) is false. If (3) contains an implicit qualification -- and it is being used to tell us about the content of Shakespeare's famous play -- then it is also false. In the play, it is quite clear that Hamlet exists. (It is less clear, though, that the ghost of Hamlet's father exists.) What gloss can an artifactualist give to (3) that makes it come out true? The suscpicion is that there is no such gloss. The challenge for Kripke is to find such a gloss.

Kripke expresses dissatisfaction with a number of purported solutions to the problem of negative existentials that might be proffered on behalf of the artifactualist, before outlining his own preferred solution. One of the solutions Kripke rejects, for good reason, is a solution that trades on a meta-linguistic paraphrase of negative existentials. According to this sort of solution, when someone utters (3), she just means:

4. 'Hamlet' does not refer, or

5. 'Hamlet' is an empty name

But, Kripke points out, this sort of solution runs into numerous difficulties.

Problem 1: the problem of counterfactual contexts. It seems the solution "doesn't apply to a counterfactual use" (152). To illustrate Kripke's point, consider the following two counterfactual suppositions.

6. If Barack Obama hadn't existed, Malia Obama wouldn't have either, and

7. If 'Barack Obama' hadn't referred, 'Malia Obama' wouldn't have either

Proponents of the metalinguistic analysis should say that these statements are equivalent. But intuitively, (6) is true and (7) is false (or, at least, not true). This is because the closest worlds in which 'Barack Obama' doesn't refer are worlds in which his parents give him a different first name. But that fact would be unlikely to affect the Obamas' choice of name for their first born daughter (and nor would it affect whether Malia existed at all).

Problem 2: use-mention conflation. Proponents of the metalinguistic analysis seem to be confusing cases of using a name with cases where the name is merely mentioned. An anthropologist who sees a written occurrence of a name 'Santa Claus' and asks whether it refers seems to be asking an entirely different question to that asked by a suspicious child who, in a deflated tone, asks whether Santa Claus exists. The answer to both questions is no. But as Kripke points out, "the anthropologist may not learn thereby what the child learns -- that Santa Claus doesn't exist. In fact, even though he is grown up, he may still believe in Santa Claus, referring to him by a different name" (153).

Problem 3: the problem of indirect discourse. The metalinguistic analysis cannot be applied straightforwardly to cases of indirect discourse. To illustrate, consider the following statements.

8. The ancient Greeks believed that Zeus exists

9. The ancient Greeks believed that 'Zeus' has a referent

As Kripke points out, with respect to the English name 'Zeus,' for all we know "it may be the case that the Greeks either used a different name, or that they didn't have any name at all" (154). So, contrary to what the metalinguistic analysis predicts, if Kripke's supposition is true, (8) is true, but (9) is false.

For these reasons, Kripke rejects the metalinguistic analysis. In its place he tentatively puts forward an alternative proposal. The proposal requires him to postulate a further ambiguity, this time in the meaning of fictional names. Earlier, in Lecture III, Kripke remarks that a "name such as 'Hamlet' [or 'Sherlock Holmes'] might have been said to designate nothing, or only pretend to designate something; one also . . . speaks of it as designating a fictional character" (72). Once the ambiguity is recognized, Kripke thinks a solution to the problem of negative existentials is available. To see why, consider the following.

10. Sherlock Holmes does not exist

Kripke suggests that a statement like (10) will be true only if 'Sherlock Holmes' is disambiguated so that it has no referent (155). The name, in this kind of context, will be an empty name, not a name for a fictional character. As such, this "negative existential says that there is no such true proposition that Sherlock Holmes exists -- in fact, really no such proposition at all as that Sherlock Holmes exists" (159). On Kripke's view, then, (10) is to be paraphrased more perspicuously as (11):

11. There is no proposition that Sherlock Holmes exists

But how are we to give an interpretation of (11) if the name 'Sherlock Holmes' does not refer? (11) seems to be saying of a proposition -- namely, the proposition that Sherlock Holmes exists -- that there is no such proposition. But this is nonsense. One might therefore suspect that a more charitable reading of Kripke would have us paraphrase (10) as:

12. There is no proposition expressed by the English sentence 'Sherlock Holmes exists'

Whatever the merits of this modified proposal, though, it suffers from very similar problems to that facing the metalinguistic analysis. Someone who utters (11) seems to be using sentence (10), whereas someone who utters (12) seems to be merely mentioning it (Problem 2: use-mention conflation). Moreover, (6) has a different truth-value to the following:

13. If 'Barack Obama exists' failed to express a proposition, then 'Malia Obama exists' would fail to express a proposition also.

(6) is true, but (13) is false, for the same reason (7) is false (Problem 1: the problem of counterfactual contexts). Finally, a French speaker who has read a translation of Conan Doyle's famous novels might well believe (10) without believing (12), because he has never come across the English words in (10) before (Problem 3: the problem of indirect discourse).

Kripke himself explicitly disavows this sort of reconstruction of his proposal (156-157). But once it too is rejected, it is difficult to make any sense of what the positive proposal is. This reader, therefore, couldn't help feeling disappointed at the conclusion to this otherwise tremendous work.

Overall, Reference and Existence is a tour de force. It anticipates many celebrated advances in metaphysics that took place in the years since the lectures were delivered. Parts of it have shaped the debate in the philosophy of language in the same period. It is full of deep and original insights not yet fully appreciated by those working in the field. And it completes the picture painted in Naming and Necessity, one of the most important philosophical works published in the twentieth century. Forty years was a long time to wait. It was worth it!


Peter van Inwagen, 'Creatures of Fiction,' American Philosophical Quarterly, 14 (1977): pp. 299-308.