Reference and Referring

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William P. Kabasenche, Michael O'Rourke, and Matthew H. Slater (eds.), Reference and Referring, MIT Press, 2012, 421pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262018306.

Reviewed by Brendan Balcerak Jackson, University of Konstanz


These essays -- based on papers given at the thirteenth Inland Northwest Philosophy Conference, on Reference and Referring -- are a diverse group. Proper names are central characters, as one would expect from the title. But many other characters receive significant stage time as well: anaphora, quantification, existence and ontology, the metaphysics of propositions and of linguistic expressions, the contents of visual perception, the ethical implications of social externalism, experimental philosophy, etc.. This is good news for readers; the collection offers a lot to think about. But it is unfortunate for reviewers, who cannot hope to give adequate attention to every paper in such a heterogeneous mix. I will give brief synopses of the essays, devoting a bit of extra attention to a few along the way. I hope this will help convey the wealth of interesting subject matter the book has for those who take the time to look into it.

The first essay, Jessica Pepp's "Reference and Referring: A Framework," provides some background and an overview of the collection. Pepp helpfully distinguishes between semantic and metasemantic questions about reference, and between both of these and questions about the metaphysics of reference and of content more generally.

Robin Jeshion's "Descriptivism and the Representation of Spatial Location" is a fascinating and challenging discussion of the contents of our visual representations of spatial location. Jeshion's target is what she calls internally anchored descriptivism, according to which all reference to external-world individuals in thought and language is determined by the satisfaction of descriptive conditions that include direct (non-descriptive) reference to a special class of individuals such as the agent herself, her experiences and their phenomenal qualities, her spatiotemporal location, and her possible world. She argues that internally anchored descriptivism cannot account for the way that spatial locations are visually represented. The basic problem, according to Jeshion, is that the descriptive representation of a particular location as, say, ten feet away and to the left requires specification of a perspective or an orientation: ten feet away from what?; to the left of what, and in what direction? Jeshion argues that specifying orientations ultimately requires reference to individuals that cannot be mediated by internally anchored descriptions. She also argues that this reveals a limitation in the use of intensions defined over centered possible worlds to represent the contents of language and thought.

Genoveva Martí ("Empirical Data and the Theory of Reference") discusses recent survey work done by Edouard Machery and colleagues to test intuitions about Kripke's famous Gödel/Schmidt case. In their original (2004) study they presented empirical evidence of cross-cultural variation in judgments about the case; this seemed to have substantive implications for Kripke's argument against the description theory of reference-fixing and for theorizing about the semantics of names more generally. Martí has previously argued (2009) that the data gathered cannot actually support any such substantive conclusions: the study does not reveal cross-cultural differences in the use of names; it at best reveals cross-cultural differences in the sort of theory of reference about names that untutored subjects spontaneously apply. Machery and (other) colleagues (2009) have since conducted new studies in order to address this worry. Martí examines the new studies and concludes -- quite correctly, it seems to me -- that they suffer from essentially the same shortcoming as the original. Her discussion is clear, engaging, and persuasive; one hopes that it will influence for the better future experimental research on reference.

In "Two Versions of Millianism", Scott Soames compares his Millian view with a version based on Kit Fine's (2007) semantic relationism, according to which syntactically realized relations of co-reference -- e.g. between an anaphoric pronoun and its antecedent, or between two occurrences of a proper name in a sentence -- make a difference to the proposition expressed. Thus 'Hesperus is Hesperus' and 'Hesperus is Phosphorus' express different (singular) propositions just by virtue of the fact that 'Hesperus' occurs twice in the former but not in the latter. One might wonder whether relationist Millianism offers better resources than nonrelationist Millianism for solving Frege's puzzle and the other familiar problem cases. Soames argues that it does not: relationist Millians must ultimately appeal to devices such as guises, ways of entertaining propositions and so on just as nonrelationist Millians do. This is useful material for those who are interested in figuring out how Millians can best handle the puzzles. But the essay is also valuable for the interesting and -- as far as I can see -- quite serious descriptive problems that Soames raises for relationism. Soames also urges the need to ground the relationist's coordinated propositions within a metaphysical account of propositions more generally, and raises important doubts about whether this can be done in a satisfactory way.

One puzzle generated by Millianism -- a puzzle that is the subject of Chris Tillman and Joshua Spencer's "Semantic Stipulation and Knowledge De Re" -- is that it seems to imply that we can come to know contingent de re propositions just by virtue of semantic stipulation. For example, suppose that we stipulate that 'L' is to be the name of Edward Snowden's current location (if he is currently located anywhere). According to Millianism, 'Snowden is at L' thereby comes to express a true singular proposition about a certain location, and we who have made the stipulation are arguably in a position to know this proposition without further investigation. But this seems wrong: certain people might very much like to know where Snowden currently is, and yet going through this procedure hardly seems likely to satisfy them.

In response, Tillman and Spencer suggest that a subject's belief might be informationally isolated when the subject is unable to put the belief to use for accomplishing certain practical purposes. Even though semantic stipulation does yield knowledge, they suggest that it would ordinarily be misleading to say so because the knowledge is informationally isolated for most practical purposes. (They also hold open the option of maintaining that such a high degree of informational isolation actually disqualifies the beliefs as cases of genuine knowledge.) So far this response does little more than put a label on what is puzzling about the puzzle, and it leaves a lot unexplained. For example, in the absence of evidence or reasons we would ordinarily count someone as irrational for believing that Snowden is located at L. Likewise, we would ordinarily consider someone irrational (or at least absent-minded) for failing to bring to bear her knowledge of Snowden's location on practical tasks for which it is relevant.

Why does informational isolation excuse subjects from these kinds of irrationality? Moreover, my knowledge of Snowden's location is only isolated for some purposes. If I want to make a list of sunny locations, and I happen to know that Snowden only goes where it is sunny, then I should write 'L' on my list. Why is this so, when my belief is isolated in so many other ways? Tillman and Spencer say very little explicitly about these kinds of questions. But they do suggest that the vehicle via which one believes p helps determine which purposes one can use p towards accomplishing, and so helps determine whether and in what ways a belief is informationally isolated. Presumably they would call on features of the vehicles introduced by semantic stipulation to answer these kinds of questions. For those of us with Fregean sympathies, this is an interesting turn: it comes perilously close to acknowledging a systematic correspondence between names and the epistemic significance of the thoughts expressed by means of them.

David Braun ("Hob, Nob, and Mythical Witches") takes up Geach's notorious Hob-Nob example:

(1) Hob thinks that a witch has blighted Bob's mare, and Nob wonders whether she killed Cob's sow.

The Geachian intuition about (1) is that it has a reading that can be true of a scenario in which there are no witches, and yet whose truth requires that Hob and Nob are, in some sense, thinking of the same witch (even though Hob and Nob might each be entirely unaware of the other's attitudes). If we take the Geachian intuition seriously then the challenge is to find some way to articulate this reading and capture it within a compositional semantics. Braun's discussion has two main goals. The first is to argue against Nathan Salmon's proposal, which attempts to capture the Geachian intuition by interpreting (1) as expressing a proposition about mythical witches. The second is to show that we should not take the Geachian intuition seriously, that it is ultimately something to be explained away rather than captured by semantics.

The critical discussion of Salmon is careful, detailed and relentless. Braun makes a convincing case that Salmon's mythical witches -- whether or not they exist -- are no part of the semantic content of any reading of (1), and he also builds a good case against various pragmatic variants of Salmon's proposal. But it would have been nice to see an equally rigorous attempt to explain away the Geachian intuition. Braun observes that Hob and Nob in the Geachian scenarios very closely resemble subjects who have genuine de re thoughts about one and the same supernatural woman (both in their internal make-up and in their environmental circumstances), and he speculates that this can lead to the mistaken judgment that (1) correctly describes such scenarios; such a mistake can also be encouraged by the semantic complexity of (1) and the fact that it is many-ways ambiguous. But how plausible is it that those who have the Geachian intuition are making the mistake Braun describes? We do not find it tempting, in general, to apply de re attitude ascriptions to a subject when we ourselves are aware that the relevant res does not exist, no matter how closely the subject might resemble someone who does have a de re attitude. Moreover, something analogous to Geachian intuitions can be elicited by a wider range of cases than just (1). For example, consider the following:

(2) Hob said that some witch blighted Bob's mare, but I forget which one.

The speaker who utters (2) characterizes Hob's assertion as being about a particular witch; she clearly does not report Hob as making the de dicto assertion that some witch or other blighted Bob's mare. Moreover, there is an intuitive sense in which she aims to be talking about the same witch that Hob was talking about (although she can't quite remember which one that was). And yet there is no temptation to think that the speaker incurs a commitment to witches by uttering (2). Thus it seems likely that something more systematic is going on with the Geachian intuition about (1) than a mere tendency to become overwhelmed by scope ambiguities and incorrectly employ de re ascriptions.

In "From Having in Mind to Direct Reference," Antonio Capuano argues that we need to recognize two different reference relations, grounded in two very different kinds of cognitive activity. The first kind of cognitive activity is party individuated by its external causal origin; it "proceeds from the outside in" and grounds a relation that he calls reference (191). The second kind essentially involves the speaker's formation of an intention or following of a rule or convention; the mind "reaches out to the object" and thereby grounds a relation that he calls denotation. Capuano maintains that reference, in his sense, ultimately provides the best foundational account of the descriptive notion of direct reference, the phenomenon whereby an expression (e.g., a proper name or a demonstrative) contributes only its referent to the propositions expressed by the sentences in which it occurs.

In "Necessity in Reference," Ori Simchen argues that names have their actual referents necessarily, i.e., that a name-type N that actually refers to entity o could not have referred to any other entity (and could not have failed to refer to o). His argument starts from the premise that tokens of a name-type are individuated partly by the referential intentions that produce them: what distinguishes a token of 'Kermit' from a mere instance of a sound pattern is, in part, the fact that it was caused by an intention to refer to Kermit. Referential intentions, in turn, are individuated by their causal-historical relations to individuals: nothing counts as an intention to refer to Kermit unless it is appropriately causally related to Kermit. It follows that every token of 'Kermit' essentially refers to Kermit, and hence -- given that the modal properties of name-types are determined by those of their tokens -- that the name-type refers to Kermit as a matter of necessity.

Standard foundational theories of reference attempt to answer the question of what makes it the case that a name N refers to an object O for a particular speaker S. In "Has the Theory of Reference Rested on a Mistake?" Mark Hinchliff suggests that it is a mistake to approach the theory of reference in this subjectivist way, because it presumes that reference is grounded in facts about the individual speaker -- the description she associates with N, the referential intentions with which she uses N or whatever. Against this Hinchliff articulates a consumerist conception, according to which the basic notion is that of N referring to O in public language L (rather than for a particular speaker S). Except for cases of dubbing or baptism, individual speakers do not assign reference; they simply use the name with the reference it already has in the language. Hence Hinchliff replaces the question of what facts about the individual speaker ground reference for her with the question of what social facts establish and sustain the reference of N within the community of L-speakers. Of course, on the consumerist view we must also ask: what facts about the individual speaker make it the case that she is a speaker of L, i.e., of a language in which N refers to O? It is not hard to re-tool traditional subjectivist theories of reference so that they provide answers (right or wrong) to this new question, which suggests that the shift to a consumerist perspective might not bring with it such a radical change of subject after all. But posing the question about reference in this way might call attention to a wider range of potential answers.

In "Referring to What Is and to What Isn't," Jody Azzouni returns to his view (see, e.g., Azzouni (2010)) that natural language devices of reference and quantification have standard uses that are "entirely numb to ontological distinctions" (254). In ordinary language we refer to and quantify over hallucinated, fictional and other unreal entities just as readily as over real entities, without thereby incurring any commitments concerning their ontological status. (The Hob-Nob case and cases like (2) are obvious grist for Azzouni's mill, although Braun is surely not ready to go along.) Azzouni argues that this does not require us to overhaul standard truth-conditional semantic theories, because such theories can be stated in a meta-language that is no less ontologically numb than the object-language. However, Azzouni argues, only in some cases do the theorems of such a theory correlate sentences with their truth-makers. The sentence 'Socrates is wise' is made true by how things are with Socrates, and this is reflected in a standard semantics for the sentence. Standard (Azzouni-style) semantics also tells us that 'Mickey Mouse is depicted as a mouse' is true if and only if Mickey Mouse is depicted as a mouse. But this sentence is not made true by how things are with Mickey Mouse, because Mickey Mouse is not real. Rather, its truth is "induced" by how things are with various cartoons; this is not reflected in the semantics, which is indifferent to the ontological difference between Socrates and Mickey Mouse.

Kenneth A. Taylor ("Reference and Jazz Combo Theories of Meaning") defends a version of realism about sub-sentential semantic properties, including reference. Taylor's realism maintains that a sentence has its meaning because of the meanings of its parts and how they are combined; the semantic properties of sub-sentential expressions are explanatorily prior to the meanings of the sentences in which they occur. This runs counter to the view (expressed, e.g., by Brandom (1994), Davidson (1974) and Dummett (1981)) that sub-sentential semantic properties are, in some sense, mere abstractions from the meanings of whole sentences. Showing remarkable patience with the anti-realist literature with which he engages, Taylor helpfully distinguishes various senses in which it is correct to say that the sentence is prior to its parts, and argues that none of these sorts of priority conflicts with realism. He also argues that realism is compatible with the phenomenon of semantic bootstrapping, whereby a given sub-sentential expression comes to have a meaning by virtue of occurring in sentences that are used to perform certain types of speech acts with certain contents.

The purpose of Chad Carmichael's "Quantification and Conversation" is to defend the possibility of a pragmatic account of quantifier domain restriction (what Carmichael calls generalism) over a semantic account (restrictionism).

(3) Everything is in the car.

The restrictionist claims that (3) is context-sensitive, and that in a typical context it expresses a proposition about some contextually salient domain of entities, such as the proposition that everything needed for the road trip is in the car. The generalist maintains that the literal content of (3) relative to every context is the proposition that everything in the universe is in the car; the restricted proposition is not literally expressed, but is rather communicated via familiar Gricean pragmatic mechanisms. (How, exactly, this happens is not Carmichael's subject.) Carmichael responds to several objections that have been taken to count against the viability of a generalist approach. The most serious of these objections is what has come to be known as the binding argument, due to Stanley and Szabó (2000).

 (4) In every room in John's house, every bottle is in the corner.

An utterance of (4) typically conveys the proposition that in every room x in John's house, every bottle that is in x is in the corner; the domain of entities over which the embedded quantifier 'every bottle' ranges varies as a function of the rooms in John's house. Thus it appears as though the interpretation of 'every bottle' in (4) is semantically sensitive to the higher quantifier 'every room in John's house'. But the generalist denies that there is any (relevant) covert variable or parameter in 'Every bottle is in the corner' that could explain the sensitivity, and if so then it is not at all obvious how the generalist can adequately explain the intuitive reading of (4). By contrast, Stanley and Szabó's restrictionist account captures it straightforwardly.

Unfortunately, Carmichael's response to Stanley and Szabó's challenge is rather disappointing. His first reconstruction of their argument is as follows:

i. 'In every room' in [(4)] binds something.

ii. So it must bind a quantifier-domain variable that is covert in [(4)].

iii. The covert presence of a quantifier-domain variable in [(4)] is inconsistent with generalism.

iv. So generalism is false.

Carmichael is quick to point out that the step from (i) to (ii) is invalid, because even if 'every room' in (4) binds some variable in the embedded sentence 'Every bottle is in the corner,' the variable it binds need not be one that ranges over quantifier domains. Indeed, you would expect it to bind a variable that ranges over rooms -- and in fact this is exactly what it does on Stanley and Szabó's own account, which should provide Carmichael (and us) with strong reason to suspect that the argument above is not an adequate reconstruction of their challenge. Carmichael does go on to consider a second reconstruction that drops the claim that the covert variable must range over quantifier domains. Thus the real challenge, according to Carmichael's reconstruction, is that the covert presence of a variable of any sort in (4) is supposed to be inconsistent with generalism.

This is still a strawman: it is clear enough from Stanley and Szabó's discussion that the basic issue is not whether generalism is strictly consistent with the binding data, but rather whether generalism can provide a good explanation for it -- and in particular whether it can provide an explanation that is as good as or better than a restrictionist explanation. (Stanley (2005) also emphasizes the abductive construal of the binding argument.) But in any case, Carmichael's response seems to be to concede that there is a covert variable in embedded cases like (4) -- and thus simply to accept the restrictionist's explanation of these cases -- but to deny that this implies the presence of a covert variable in the simple, unembedded cases. This is not a new strategy (Carmichael notes that it is pursued in Récanati (2004)). In fact, Stanley and Szabó already discuss it in their original paper and provide direct evidence against it from cases of sentential ellipsis (cf. also Stanley (2000)). Unfortunately, Carmichael does not mention their discussion, and he does not indicate how the generalist might try to explain the ellipsis data. Carmichael's response to the binding argument thus ultimately advances the discussion very little.

In "<the, a>: (In)definiteness and Implicature," Laurence R. Horn and Barbara Abbott develop and defend a "neo-neo-Russellian" view of definite and indefinite descriptions. According to their proposal, 'a' and 'the' both make the same semantic contribution to the truth conditions of sentences in which they occur; both 'an F is G' and 'the F is G' are true just in case there is at least one F that is G. The difference between them is pragmatic rather than semantic: 'the F is G' conventionally implicates that there is a unique (contextually relevant) F, while 'a(n) F is G' does not. Horn and Abbott marshal an impressive array of data in support of their case, much of it collected "in the wild" from corpora and the internet. One interesting type of data concerns occurrences of the articles in contrastive environments such as the following (harvested via Google):

(5) His Divine Death was not only an Answer, but the Answer.

(6) During the cold war, Europe was understandably a -- or even the -- geographic focus of international relations.

As Horn and Abbott note, in these examples 'a' is represented as being insufficiently informative in comparison with 'the', and the point of the comparison appears to be to emphasize uniqueness. Thus they take 'the' and 'a' to form an informativeness scale, with 'the' being more informative than 'a' by virtue of expressing at least and at most one rather than merely at least one. (Of course, for Horn and Abbott there is a difference in informativeness only when we factor in both truth-conditional content and conventional implicature.)

This is certainly a plausible explanation of the data. But I worry that in their critical discussion of the view they take as their main rival -- the familiarity account developed by Szabó (2000) and by Ludlow and Segal (2004) -- Horn and Abbott go astray. The familiarity account agrees with Horn and Abbott that 'a' and 'the' make the same purely existential contribution to truth-conditions. Horn and Abbott also seem to assume that the familiarity account agrees with them that the difference between the articles is a matter of conventional implicature. They take the parting of ways to come only when deciding on what, exactly, gets conventionally implicated by 'the F is G', with the familiarity account claiming that it is something like the proposition that there is an F that is already familiar in the conversation.

This claim is the focus of their main objection to the familiarity account: they observe that there are many uses of 'the F' that generate no implicature of familiarity, and they take this to be incompatible with the existence of a familiarity conventional implicature. However, the objection misconstrues the familiarity account. The crucial feature of Szabó's account, for example, is that 'the' is associated with a special pragmatic rule that governs how hearers are to respond to utterances of 'the F is G': the rule states roughly that the hearer is to respond by identifying some F that is already familiar in the conversation and updating her body of information with the new information that this individual is G. Mutual knowledge of this rule then helps to explain how utterances of 'the F is G' sometimes conversationally implicate that there is a unique (contextually relevant) F. Szabó (2003) does claim that this rule is associated with 'the' by convention, but this is not at all to say that 'the F is G' conventionally implicates that there is a familiar F. Thus even if Horn's and Abbott's cases count against the existence of a familiarity conventional implicature, this does not speak against the actual familiarity account. The cases themselves call for some explanation, of course, but they do not automatically show that 'the' cannot be conventionally associated with a pragmatic rule like Szabó's; after all, rules are made to be broken, in language use at least as much as elsewhere.

Perhaps also interesting is that there is contrastive data, analogous to the data in (4)-(6), that seems to speak in favor of the familiarity account:

(7) I didn't receive a call this afternoon, I received the call.

Here the intuitive contrast is between receiving some call or other and receiving a particular, conversationally salient call, such as an important call about a possible job that the speaker has been expecting. This, too, can be understood in terms of an informativeness scale -- a familiar F is intuitively more informative than some F or other -- and the ordering of the articles on such a scale seems to be confirmed by the possibility of metalinguistic negation:

(8)  a. Did you get your paper accepted at a journal?

       b. No, I got it accepted at the journal.

The dialogue in (8) makes perfect sense if there is a particularly good or notoriously corrupt journal that has been under discussion. Notice also that in neither (7) nor (8) is there any implicature of uniqueness; this should give Horn and Abbott pause, since they take 'the' to be associated with a uniqueness conventional implicature that cannot be overridden. It appears, then, that Horn and Abbott, no less than the familiarity theorists, have some difficult data to explain (notwithstanding the fact that the data here were raised domestically rather than captured in the wild).

In "Reference and Ambiguity in Complex Demonstratives," Geoff Georgi develops an alternative to the orthodox view of complex demonstratives, expressions of the form 'that F' or 'this F,' according to which such expressions are context-sensitive directly referential expressions. As King (2001) argues, the orthodox view has trouble dealing with cases like the following:

(9) That hominid who discovered how to start fires was a genius.

(10) Most avid skiers remember that first black diamond run they attempted to ski.

Georgi argues that the real problem posed both by sentences like (9) and by cases of "quantifying in" like (10) is that the complex demonstrative is used nonreferentially, i.e., without any accompanying demonstration or referential intention on the part of the speaker. (This requires Georgi to wade into a debate between King and Nathan Salmon about whether or not the complex demonstrative in (10) counts as a rigid designator.) Georgi's solution is an ambiguity view that treats standard referential uses as on the orthodox view, and treats nonreferential uses as analogous to cases of deferred reference -- as when one points at a car and utters 'That person doesn't take care of his car' intending to refer to the driver.

The last essay, Stavroula Glezakos's "Words Gone Sour?", concerns the implications of semantic anti-individualism for derogatory words such as 'Oriental'. She focuses on Jennifer Hornsby's assertion that derogatory words are "useless for us" who do not have the derogatory attitudes such words convey, and that we instead use neutral counterparts that apply to the same people but that do not convey these attitudes. Glezakos's discussion suffers a bit from the fact that she never really makes clear what exactly Hornsby's assertion is supposed to mean. It is easy enough to understand it as the rather harmless suggestion that we should avoid using derogatory words because their use conveys derogatory attitudes whether or not we intend them to. But Glezakos focuses mainly on the suggestion that we can or should use neutral counterparts in their place. She points out that allegedly neutral expressions -- expressions such as 'person with Chinese heritage' or 'someone from East Asia' -- are typically used to help identify a derogated category or class of persons, and she argues that there is a danger that the allegedly neutral terms take on the same capacity as recognized derogatory terms to convey derogatory attitudes; saying of someone that he is 'Canadian but his parents are from China' can convey the same derogatory attitudes as describing him as 'Oriental'. I doubt that semantic anti-individualism, alone, is enough to establish Glezakos's conclusion; she seems also to rely on further positive assumptions about what kinds of social facts determine meaning. But Glezakos provides interesting historical and contemporary evidence that illustrates how difficult it is to separate out the role of derogatory terms and their allegedly neutral counterparts in perpetuating derogatory attitudes. And it is fitting for the last essay of the collection to serve as an illustration of the fact that the theory of reference sometimes matters in ways that go far beyond the seminar room.


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