Reference and Reflexivity

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Perry, John, Reference and Reflexivity, CSLI Publications, 2001, 195 pp, $19.50 (pbk), ISBN 1-57586-310-3.

Reviewed by Marga Reimer, University of Arizona


Perry's Critical Referentialism 1 The General View

In his new book, Reference and Reflexivity, John Perry develops a “reflexive-referential” account of indexicals and proper names, an account adumbrated in some of his earlier work. 2 According to Perry’s reflexive-referentialism (also referred to by Perry as “critical referentialism”), utterances of sentences containing indexicals and proper names semantically convey several different propositions. One of these conveyed propositions constitutes the utterance’s “referential content” and is the very content that direct-reference theorists and Millians have been promoting since the late sixties: a “singular” proposition containing the object/individual referred to by the indexical/proper name. The referential content of an utterance containing an indexical/proper name is called “official content” as it purportedly captures our robust intuitions as to “what is said” by such utterances. The problem with the referential view, as is well-known, is that referential content does not account for puzzles of cognitive significance. There are two basic puzzles: (i) statements containing different but co-referring indexicals/names differ in cognitive significance 3; (ii) statements involving empty indexicals/names can be cognitively significant. These are puzzles on the view that the only content of an indexical/name is its referent. Instead of making the usual referentialist move and dismissing issues of cognitive significance by claiming (in effect) that such issues are irrelevant to semantics proper, Perry posits another layer of content. This other layer of content, called “reflexive content,” is content in the fullest sense—just like referential content, it is truth-conditional. In particular, such content incorporates the truth conditions of an utterance, specifying these conditions in terms of the utterance itself. Thus, reflexive content is called “reflexive” because it makes reference to the utterance itself. More specifically, the reflexive content of an indexical expression specifies “identifying conditions” for reference: conditions an object/individual must satisfy if it is to emerge as the referential content of that expression. Thus, while the reflexive content of an utterance of ‘I’ is the speaker of this token of ‘I’, the reflexive content of an utterance of ‘you’ is the addressee of this token of ‘you’. Reflexive content is then invoked to solve puzzles (i) and (ii) above. Perry claims that the puzzles arise only because the referentialist fails to acknowledge any sort of content other than referential content.

The motivation for the reflexive-referential account of indexicals and names is a simple one. The account purports to capture Fregean insights regarding cognitive significance, while at the same time capturing the insights of direct-reference theorists like Kripke (1980), Kaplan (1979), and Millians like Salmon (1986) and Soames (1989). Perry believes that the view has yet to be considered seriously because of a pervasive way of thinking that embodies what he calls the "subject matter fallacy." The subject matter fallacy is the assumption that the proposition that captures the subject matter of an utterance (referential content for Perry) is the sole content of that utterance.


Consider utterances of the following two sentences, supposing the first to be uttered by David Israel and the second to be uttered by John Perry, who is addressing David Israel.

(1) I am a computer scientist
(2) You are a computer scientist

On the critical-referentialist account proposed by Perry, both utterances "say" the same thing, have the same "official content": a singular proposition that David Israel is a computer scientist. Yet such utterances differ in regards to cognitive significance: a linguistically competent speaker will learn different things from each of them: from the first, that the speaker of ’I’ as it occurs in an utterance of (1) is a computer scientist; from the second, that the addressee of ’you’ as it occurs in an utterance of (2) is a computer scientist. These propositions constitute the "reflexive contents" of (1) and (2) respectively, and appeal to such contents is supposed to solve the co-reference problem. Appeal to such contents also purportedly solves the "no-reference" problem for indexicals. To see this, just suppose that participants at a faculty meeting are eagerly awaiting the arrival of a computer scientist. Someone hears a door open, and mistakenly thinking it signifies the arrival of the computer scientist, utters (2). The indexical expression is empty; the door was open by a gust of air. The utterance though is still cognitively significant as it conveys the proposition that the addressee of the uttered indexical is a computer scientist. (Because definite descriptions are not referential, there is no problem with non-denoting descriptions--we can give them their standard quantificational analysis.)


Perry does not think that names are indexicals; nevertheless, he believes that his reflexive-referential account generalizes to proper names. Here’s how it works. Consider an utterance of the following sentence:

(3) David Israel is a computer scientist.

On Perry’s Millian view, the proposition expressed is the same singular proposition expressed by the utterances of (1) and (2) described above: that David Israel is a computer scientist. How, then, explain the clear difference in cognitive significance between utterances of those sentences and an utterance of (3)? By appealing to reflexive content--content about the utterance itself. Perry adopts the view that proper names refer via what he calls "permissive conventions." Such conventions are established when a person or thing is assigned a name: that name may then be used to designate that person or thing. When a name is used to refer to a person, the speaker is exploiting a convention of this sort. These conventions provide the basis for the "identifying conditions" an entity must meet if it is to emerge as the referential content of a given name. Perry thus parses the reflexive content of (3) as:

(4) That the person the convention exploited by (3) permits one to designate with ’David Israel’ is a computer scientist.

This content can then be appealed to solve the Frege’s Puzzle version of the co-reference problem. Consider utterances of (5) and (6):

(5) Bill Clinton is Bill Clinton.
(6) Bill Clinton is Bill Blythe.

Suppose that (5) is uttered with the intention of expressing a triviality. 4 While referential content is one and the same, reflexive contents differ and differ in ways that enable us to account for the intuitive differences in cognitive significance between (5) and (6). In particular, the reflexive contents of these two utterances get parsed as (7) and (8) respectively:

(7) that the person the convention exploited by (5) permits one to designate by ’Bill Clinton’ is the person the convention exploited by (5) permits one to designate by ’Bill Clinton’.
(8) that the person the convention exploited by (5) permits one to designate by ’Bill Clinton’ is the person the convention exploited by (5) permits one to designate by ’Bill Blythe’.

No wonder then, an utterance of (5) sounds trivial, while an utterance of (6) sounds informative. A grasp of the reflexive content of (5) suffices to recognize that utterance as true; the same is not true for an utterance of (6).

Perry admits that appeal to naming conventions won’t help him with the no-reference problem. The reason is simple: what doesn’t exist cannot be linked to any sort of naming convention, however "permissive." If Jacob Horn does not exist, there is no convention that permits reference to him. Nevertheless, causal/historical chains of communication underlie the use of proper names, empty or not, and these chains of communication--"networks"--as Perry calls them, can be appealed to in order to explain cognitive significance--and in particular, the fact that we can talk and think "about" such individuals as Jacob Horn. 5 Thus, consider utterances of sentences (9) and (10):

(9) Jacob Horn does not exist.
(10) Jacob Horn was an important person in colonial America.

Both utterances seem to say something. There is no referential content, but there is reflexive content. The reflexive contents of utterances of (9) and (10) emerge as (11) and (12).

(11) That the network that supports the use of the name ’Jacob Horn’ in (9) has no origin.
(12) That the network that supports the use of the name ’Jacob Horn’ has an origin and he was an important person in colonial America.

Thus, utterances of sentences containing empty names are cognitively significant, not because of their referential content, for they have no such content. 6 They are cognitively significant in virtue of the network-based reflexive content.

So much for Perry’s reflexive-referential view of indexicals and proper names. Now let’s evaluate its purported merits.


Perry claims with good reason that his account captures the insights of direct-reference theorists (including Millians). After all, he contends that the "official content," what is said, by the utterance of a sentence containing an indexical or proper name is precisely what such theorists claim it is: a singular proposition containing the referred to object/individual. Such a view is an "insight" according to Perry, because it is supported by two powerful arguments: the argument from counterfactual truth conditions and the argument from same-saying. The first appeals to the intuition that an utterance of a sentence like (1), where the indexical is used to refer to (say) Israel, would be true in a counterfactual world in which Israel was a computer scientist--even if Israel never uttered any such sentence in that world. The second appeals to the intuition that utterances of sentences like (1) through (3) can, and sometimes do, "say" the same thing. Both sorts of intuitions are easily accommodated on a referential account of indexicals/proper names. What of Perry’s claim to have captured the insights of Fregean and Russellians--to have provided successful solutions to the co-reference and no-reference problems? Here, I do have some doubts. Perry’s reflexive content does capture certain insights of some of Perry’s philosophical ancestors; it captures the insights of Reichenbach’s (1947) token-reflexive account of indexicals; and it captures the insights of meta-linguistic accounts of proper names promoted (at one time or another) by Frege, Russell, and even Mill himself. 7 But is there anything genuinely Fregean about Perry’s account? 8 Perry’s account is arguably Fregean in the sense that it regards cognitive significance as a phenomenon to be accounted for by a semantic theory. But is Perry’s "cognitive significance" what Frege was so worked up about in the opening paragraph of "On Sense and Reference"? I don’t think so. It seems to me that Frege’s sense/reference distinction--even if similar in spirit to Perry’s reflexive-content/referential-content distinction--captures rather different insights. This should hardly come as a surprise, since of course the distinctions are quite different. Frege’s cognitive significance is not explicable by appealing to meta-linguistic considerations of the sort Perry appeals to via his reflexive content. This is suggested by two facts: (i) Frege’s explicit rejection of meta-linguistic content as a candidate for explaining differences in "cognitive value" and (ii) the natural generalizability of identity statements involving names to identity statements involving kind terms, a generalizability not supported by Perry’s account. Let’s begin with (i). Frege makes clear that genuine knowledge cannot be mere meta-linguistic knowledge. Thus, cognitive significance cannot (for Frege) be explained by the positing of meta-linguistic content. This makes a great deal of sense. Consider the following two identity sentences, both of which (suppose) are true:

(13) Ek is Batura.
(14) Ek is Ek.

Suppose we adopt Perry’s view and thus regard both sentences as expressing meta-linguistic reflexive contents. Is the apparent difference in cognitive value between the two thereby explained? Not according to Frege, who claims that the cognitive values on such a reading--a reading which distinguishes the terms by their "shape" alone--are "essentially the same." They are essentially the same for Frege, because they express only what is an arbitrary linguistic fact: that the two "shapes" co-refer. That’s not much in the way of genuine knowledge about the world: in fact, it’s nothing. For to be told that two names co-refer is to be told nothing that isn’t determined by what is in effect an arbitrary stipulation. Once we individuate the signs by their modes of presentation (comet identified by Ek May 12, 2002 in Norway; comet identified independently by Batura May 12, 2002 in Poland) the difference in cognitive values is easily explained.

Now let’s move on to (ii). Frege’s worries about cognitive significance extend quite naturally from proper names to kind terms. The worry associated with ’Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is surely similar in kind to the worry associated with identity statements involving co-referring kind terms. How can either type of sentence impart genuine knowledge if the terms on either side of the identity sign are co-referring? But if the worries are at bottom the same, a solution to cases involving proper names should generalize to cases involving other referring expressions, like kind terms. Let’s focus on a recent case from biology, from entomology in particular. Is it reasonable to suppose that the cognitive significance ’Harpalus pleuricticus is Harpalus fallax’, as understood by a speaker who is acquainted with "both" species of Wisconsin beetle, might be captured by a reflexive content to the effect that the two expressions are co-referring? Suppose the entomologist recognizes the harpalus pleuricticus by its narrow and reddish-yellow body. Suppose she recognizes the harpalus fallax by its comparatively stout and reddish-black body. These are of course different species (so she thinks) as their genus/species names indicate. But then it is discovered (with the assistance of a hefty NSF grant) that harpalus pleuricticus is harpalus fallax; there are not two species but one (now called "harpalus somnulentus"). Is the cognitive significance of the utterance explained by supposing that it has a reflexive content to the effect that "Harpalus pleuricticus" and "Harpalus fallax" name the same species? Such reflexive contents might well explain what a non-expert might glean from the utterance. (The same considerations apply to utterances of " Ek is Batura" and "Hesperus is Phosphorus.") But Frege is concerned with the significance that the statement would have to someone who, in an intuitive sense, "knows what is being talked about." To any such person, the statement expresses a genuine discovery about the (insect) world, not about mere words.

But then we should not expect Perry’s account of indexicals/proper names to generalize to kind terms. But if it does not generalize in this way, it seems unlikely that the analysis yields a plausible explanation of the phenomenon that Frege himself was so concerned with in the opening paragraphs of "On Sense and Reference."

However, Perry’s account does appear to provide the resources for explaining how a rational person might accept an utterance u1 and yet refuse to accept another utterance u2 that "says" the very same thing. It is the difference in the utterances’ reflexive contents that leads to such situations.


Perry’s new book is engaging and readable. It’s on a topic that is of enormous importance to contemporary philosophy of language--with potential implications for related issues in epistemology, philosophy of mind, and cognitive science. But these are not sufficient reasons to recommend the book. I recommend the book, and do so strongly, on the grounds that it provides a promising account of indexicals and proper names, one that appears equipped to solve some of the vexing puzzles such expressions generate.


Almog, J, J. Perry and H. Wettstein, eds. 1989. Themes from Kaplan. New York: Oxford University Press.

Donnellan, K, 1974. Speaking of Nothing. Philosophical Review, LXXV: 281-304.

Evans, G, 1973. The Causal Theory of Names. Supplementary Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 47: 187-208.

Kaplan, D, 1979. On the logic of demonstratives. The Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8: 81-98.

Kripke, S, 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.

Mill, J.S., A System of Logic. New York: Harper Brothers.

Perry, J, 2000. The Problem of the Essential Indexical. Expanded edition. Stanford: CSLI.

Reichenbach, H, 1947. Elements of Symbolic Logic. New York: The Free Press.

Salmon, N, 1986. Frege’s Puzzle. Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.

Soames, S, 1989. Direct Reference and Propositional Attitudes. In Almog et al., 1989: 393-419.


1. I would like to thank Kent Bach, Mike Harnish, and Dave Chalmers, whose helpful discussions re Perry’s book informed this review.

2. See the later papers in The Problem of the Essential Indexical (2000).

3. Such statements include propositional attitude attributions.

4. Of course, it needn’t be used for this purpose. It might instead be used to convey the fact that Bill Clinton the neighbor is Bill Clinton the ex-president. For a similar case, see Perry’s discussion (in section 6 of chapter 6) of ’Paderewski is Paderewski’.

5. In appealing to such causal/historical networks, Perry is drawing on earlier work by causal theorists like Donnellan (1974), Kripke (1980), and Evans (1973).

6. They do, however, have what Perry calls "intentional content," content which, like referential content, is supposed to capture intuitions about "what is said." (For details, see Perry, pp. 149-150.)

7. Mill (1843), the first to use the "Cicero is Tully" example, claimed that in the case of identity statements between names, what is said is that the individuals bearing the names in question are identical.

8. Perry grapples with these and related issues in the concluding chapter of his book.