Reference and Representation in Thought and Language

Placeholder book cover

María de Ponte and Kepa Korta (eds.), Reference and Representation in Thought and Language, Oxford University Press, 2017, 283 pp., $85.00, ISBN 9780198714217.

Reviewed by Antonio Capuano, Auburn University


This is a welcome addition to the ongoing debate on reference. Both philosophers of language and linguists contributed to the volume, and the topics of the papers vary considerably. However, as the editors explain in the introduction, "one relevant element common to all contributions is that . . . even if none of them questions that singular terms are typically used to refer directly to individual objects, most of them address issues beyond reference" (2). The book can be of interest to both graduate students and scholars that work in philosophy of language, linguistics, and philosophy of mind. Given the limited space I have in this review, I'll say something about each paper, aware I am not able to do justice to any one of them.

The book opens with an essay by Genoveva Marti on proper names, "Names, predicates, and the object-property distinction." In the last few years, the view that proper names are predicates has gained some traction in philosophy of language and linguistics. In particular, Ora Matushansky and Delia Graff Fara have offered a set of examples that seem to be difficult to explain if proper names are referential devices. They claim that instead the very same data can be explained if proper names are looked at as predicates. In turn, philosophers of language, most notably Robin Jeshion, have offered their own syntactic and semantic objections to the view that proper names are predicates. To counter the view that names are predicates, Genoveva Marti does not offer new syntactic or semantic considerations. According to her, the problem with the view is deeper. It "does not reflect the underlying metaphysics correctly, for it does not reflect, in the semantics, a distinction that is metaphysically important and hence crucial to our conception of the world and its structure" (15).

The basic metaphysical distinction that the view obliterates is that between object and property. However, it is unclear why a predicativist obliterates such a distinction. As Marti herself recognizes, it is not that "predicativism entails that there is no distinction between objects and properties". The point is rather than "the distinction is not reflected in the semantics" (15 fn.3). Again, however, one wonders why. Consider Bertrand Russell. To be sure, Russell maintains that there is a metaphysical distinction between objects and properties that is reflected in the semantics. It is just that ordinary proper names such as "Socrates" are not logically proper names and do not simply stand for objects. Other linguistic expressions function as logically proper names. At one point in his career, Russell came to believe that "this" functions like a logically proper name. It is unclear to me why a predicativist cannot rely on the same strategy and simply argue that some linguistic expressions refer but that ordinary proper names are not among them. This is not to say that the view that names are predicates is correct. Simply, I am not sure that Martí's objection undermines the view.

Toward the end of her paper, Martí offers what I take to be a different observation against the view that proper names are predicates. The property of being red exists independently of the predicate "is red" whereas the property all those individuals called "John" share depends on the fact that speakers use "John" to talk about John:

John Perry would not be under the alleged predicate 'John' if it weren't for the fact that the name is used to make him the subject of discourse so that things could be said about him, so that properties could be attributed to him, in other words if it weren't for the fact that there are uses of the name that refer to him. That's what makes John a member of the set of things that are, according to the predicativist, under the extension of the 'predicate' 'John.' (18-9)

If this is true, however

what grounds the predicativist explanation is the fact that names are referential devices, not predicates. Surely John Perry and John Etchemendy are both called John; they have that property in common. But they do have that property in common because the names were bestowed on them. Reference was there before satisfaction. (19)

If this is the case, it seems that the view that names are predicates presupposes the fact that names refer.

The paper by Eros Corazza, "Gender, context sensitivity, and conversational implicatures", concerns proper names as well. However, it concerns an issue that, to the best of my knowledge, has not received much attention by philosophers of language. Some names, e.g. "Paul," "Paolo," "Pierre", are standardly used to talk about males. Other names, e.g. "Ortensia," "Mary," "Paola", are standardly used to talk about females. Others are gender-silent. Corazza's main thesis is that we should think of the information conveyed by these names as stereotypical information that can be treated along the lines of Grice's treatment of generalized conversional implicature. Consider the name "Sue." It carries the stereotypical information that it stands for a female. However, there is nothing contradictory in "Sue is a man" and the implicature that it stands for a female can be cancelled as when I say that Sue is a man. Corazza's point is that it is not part of the meaning of the name that "Sue" typically stands for females:

The fact that 'Sue' is normally used as a name for females doesn't belong to one's linguistic competence. It belongs . . . to one's world knowledge. We can recognize two types of convention: linguistic conventions (which belong to linguistic competence) and conventions of use (which may belong to some pragmatic and practical competence). The latter, unlike the former, affect the way one can calculate conversational implicatures. In the case of names, they affect . . . the generalized conversational implicatures triggered by the extrinsic stereotypical information associated with the name. In learning English one comes to know that, on top of being a proper name, 'Sue' is usually used to refer to females, and "Paul" to males. (35)

However, if this is something one learns by learning English one wonders why it is not part of a speaker's linguistic competence.

The third paper, by John Perry, is about indexicals. Perry played an enormous role in framing the current debate about indexicals, i.e., words like "I," "you," "here," "now" etc. In this paper, Perry suggests that his approach does better than Kaplan's in treating indexicals. To be clear, he does not think that he has refuted Kaplan. Perry acknowledges that various moves can be made to account for his observations. Nonetheless, as Perry explains: "In Kaplan's theory, contexts do two things. First they model utterances, or potential utterances. The agent is required to be at the location at the time in the world, but doesn't have to say anything. Second, they supply the inputs, the only one allowed, for the relations or functions provided by the characters of the expressions" (47-8). By contrast, in Perry's account, the two roles contexts play are separated and "the inputs may or may not be delivered by the context" (48). By separating the two functions contexts play, one gains a certain flexibility in explaining the fact that many expressions standardly included in the list of indexicals can be used unindexically. Consider, the following utterance of:

(1) Never put off until tomorrow what you can do today.

In (1) "today" and "tomorrow" are not used to refer to the day of the utterance and the day after the utterance. They have what Perry calls an undexical use: "In these uses the designation is the object that plays the mandated role vis-à-vis some agents, times, and locations supplied anaphorically, or by a quantifier" (56). Treating indexicals within a theory of utterances and distinguishing between the different roles context can play help explain this flexibility in the use speakers make of indexicals.

In "Reference, intention, and context," Kent Bach raises the question of whether demonstratives refer. Of course, Bach does not deny that demonstratives can be used by speakers to refer. He points out that this alone does not justify the conclusion that demonstratives refer in their own right. According to Bach, in fact,

in using demonstratives, we have intentions to refer but not intentions for demonstratives themselves to refer . . . If only intentions for demonstratives to refer could endow them with references but ordinary speakers do not have such intentions, demonstratives do not have semantic references. (58)

After rejecting contextualist treatments of demonstratives such as that of Howard Wettstein and Christopher Gauker, he discusses the intentionalist views of Andreas Stokke and Jeffrey King. Bach offers objections to those views as well and concludes that the view that demonstratives have semantic referents is unsupported.

In "Semantic complexity" Maite Ezcurdia critically examines Stephen Neale's noun phrase thesis (NPT). According to NPT, noun phrases are either semantically structured restricted quantifiers or semantically unstructured rigidly referring expressions. What Ezcurdia finds most questionable about the thesis is the connection it postulates between referring expressions and lack of semantic complexity. Complex demonstratives such as "that man in the corner" are an apparent counterexample to NPT. Although a referring expression, on the face of it a complex demonstrative is a semantically complex expression. Unlike proper names, complex demonstratives in fact determine their reference in a complex way. Of course, Neale is aware of the existence of complex demonstratives and the fact that they can constitute a seeming counterexample to his thesis. His strategy is, on the one hand, to explain away the alleged counterexamples and, on the other hand, to offer a general justification for NPT.

Ezcurdia claims that no such general justification has really been offered by Neale. In her paper, she considers several justifications for the thesis but find all of them lacking. Let me mention one, that is perhaps the most important:

The key argument for ruling out semantically complex referring expressions lies in what Neale calls "a constructive or compositional procedure" for obtaining the extension of an expression. For him, once we invoke such a procedure we are no longer in the realm of reference. (79)

Consider the case of definite descriptions and assume that definite descriptions do not refer. In "the head of state of New Zealand", "'head of state of New Zealand' has a predicative role in restricting the range of the quantifier 'the head of state of New Zealand', the same role it has in other restricted quantifier sentences" (81). The claim is that if a nominal functions as a predicate, then the noun phrase in which the nominal occurs cannot refer. But Ezcurdia wonders why "the mere syntactic presence of a nominal in a sentence should compel us to treat it as having a predicative role" (81). One can appeal to the idea that linguistic expressions which exhibit the same surface syntax should be treated as semantically the same. Ezcurdia offers counterexamples involving proper names such as "the United Nations" and "the Holy Roman Empire." Both names stand for what they stand for not in virtue of the fact that the descriptive content of the two names is satisfied. Therefore:

not every nominal that appears in surface syntax is to be awarded a predicative role. If we are to find a better argument from syntax in favour of assigning a predicative role to nominals in all complex noun phrases, the argument has to appeal to specific syntactic behaviour of specific noun phrases. (95)

In her paper, she offers only the gist of such an argument and rejects it. Unfortunately, in this review I do not have the space to critically examine it. Her main point is that:

unlike in quantifier phrases where the nominal has a predicative role and its contribution shows up at the truth-conditional (or propositional) level, in complex demonstratives the nominal has an individuative role and its contribution shows up at the level of linguistic meaning. Once one recognizes that there are two different semantic roles for nominals, treating complex demonstratives as semantically complex referring expressions is possible. (103)

To be clear, Ezcurdia does not believe she has shown that NPT is false. She thinks, however, she has shown that we do not have compelling reasons to believe it to be true and some reasons to believe that complex demonstratives really are referring expressions.

In "Donnellan's misdescriptions and loose talk", Carlo Penco tries to vindicate Donnellan's idea that "when a speaker uses a definite description referentially he may have stated something true or false even if nothing fits the description" (106). Penco suggests the following: "There are some contexts in which an utterance with a referential description 'The F is G' is true if the object referred to is G and not F, but it is reasonable that it might be F" (117). In his view

what is said by a referential description depends on the grade of looseness required by the context. If the meaning of a definite description is no longer "there is a unique x exactly fitting the description" but "there is a unique x at least loosely fitting the description" or "reasonably taken to be an F," then the truth conditions of a sentence with a referential misdescription are different in strict and loose talk. (119)

It is not completely clear to me whether Penco's suggestion is about how to read Donnellan's paper or about how to account for definite descriptions in ordinary language. I doubt that Donnellan's main concern was to offer a theory of meaning of definite descriptions. Aside from Donnellan, it is unclear to me whether Penco is committed to the view that definite descriptions in ordinary English are ambiguous between two different readings or not. It seems to me, in fact, that one can apply what Penco says about loose talk also to some cases of attributive uses of definite descriptions. However, if this is the case, his does not amount to a proposal to account for the semantic difference between attributive and referential uses of definite descriptions and one wonders, then, to what extent his proposal is a vindication of Donnellan's views.

In "Pre-semantic pragmatic enrichment", Yan Huang challenges the classical Gricean position according to which what is said is prior to and independent of what is conversationally implicated. According to the classical Gricean approach, semantics deals with what is said, pragmatics with what is conversationally implicated. Reflecting on the phenomenon of long-distance reflexivization, Huang aims to show that pragmatic enrichment enters into the determination of what is said and that therefore the relationships between semantics and pragmatics is not as simple as the classical Gricean position suggests.

In "The interplay of recipient design and salience in shaping speaker's utterance", Istvan Kecskes presents the main tenets of the sociocognitive approach. His sociocognitive approach attempts to combine the virtues of the individualistic, intention-based-cognitive-philosophical approach, and the virtues of the societal, context-based sociocultural-interactional approach in accounting for communication.

In "New thoughts about old facts", Maria de Ponte and Kepa Korta critically dissect an old argument offered by Arthur Prior to support the idea that there is an objective distinction between past, present, and future. According to Prior the three following utterances do not express the same proposition:

(1) Thank goodness the root canal is over [now].

(2) Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of the root canal is Friday, June 15, 1954.

(3) Thank goodness the conclusion of the root canal is contemporaneous with this utterance.

According to de Ponte and Korta, Prior is mistaken in thinking that the three utterances do not express the same proposition. However, they believe that the three utterances express different thoughts in the sense of being different ways of understanding the same proposition. Their suggestion then is that Prior's argument should be read as Jackson's argument about Mary, who is supposed to know all there is to know about colours but nonetheless seems to learn something new when she sees something red for the first time. In their view, the case of Mary does not have an ontological import and does not show that physicalism is false. Analogously, Prior's argument does not have an ontological import. De Ponte and Korta infer that

past, present, and future are indeed real and fundamental elements without which no explanation of our thoughts, emotions, and actions would be possible. But that carries no fundamental ontological weight. It is an epistemic thesis. It talks about how we, as agents, perceive and think about time, and about how events have a different impact on us depending on their temporal relation to us. It is neutral on how and what time really is. (177)

In "Cognitive dynamics", François Recanati responds to criticism offered by Andrea Onofri and Dilip Ninan of his theory of mental files. In short, they claim that mental files cannot both satisfy Frege's constraint (that if a rational subject can believe, of a given object, both that it is F and that it is not F, then the subject thinks of that object under distinct modes of presentation) and also play the role of enabling coreference de jure. To make the point, Onofri offers the following example: "If I remember that a certain object was F and, upon encountering it again, notice that it is G, I can infer: something that was F is now G" (181). This is a case of trading upon identity. However, the file associated with the object when it is presented as having the property F is a memory file while the file associated with the object having property G is a perceptual file. Then either the two files are the same and Frege's constraint is violated, or the two files are different and trading upon identity is not justified. This, however, according to Recanati is a misunderstanding of his view. When the subject infers at t2 that the object that was F is now G, she employs two premises. First, that object is G now. The second premise is the result of updating the initial memory file into the conversion file associated to "that object" in the first premise. Once the file is updated, the same file is used in the two premises and trading upon identity is justified.

In "The property theory and de se attitudes", Wayne Davis discusses the problem of de se attitudes. The problem was brought to the fore of philosophical discussion by John Perry in two seminal papers, "Frege on demonstratives" and "The problem of essential indexicals." Perry's aim was to show that the simple view according to which "to believe" stands for a diadic relation between subjects and propositions runs into trouble when it comes to explaining the difference between "Perry believes that he is making a mess" and "Perry believes that the man with a torn sack is making a mess." In his paper, Davis criticizes the property theory of de se attitudes championed, first, by David Lewis and Roderick Chisholm, and nowadays by Neil Feit. He offers ten objections. He does not think that each of them individually is decisive against the theory but that the objections taken together constitute a strong case against it. In the final two sections, Davis offers his own view. To account for de se attitudes, he postulates the existence of indexical concepts. To this proposal, Feit objected that how indexical concepts work is rather mysterious. In particular, it is unclear how they determine their extension. To this objection Davis replies that Feit's mistake -- shared by many others -- is to assume that if a concept determines the extension, it must be a descriptive concept. However, it seems to me that to say that a concept determines its own extension non-descriptively is not to say yet how it is determined. In this sense, I am not sure Davis has answered Feit's objection.

The last paper is "Selfhood as self-representation", by Kenneth Taylor. Perhaps, this is the paper least concerned with issues in philosophy of language and most engaged in issues in philosophy of mind. Taylor is trying to develop a picture of the self that is between the Cartesian picture according to which the self is a thing and the Humean picture according to which there is no such thing as the self. In Taylor's view, the self is not a substance as in the Cartesian picture. At the same time, according to Taylor, it has some reality, unlike in the Humean picture. In particular, the self is the capacity that some biological organisms have to represent themselves in certain ways.

In conclusion, the volume is a valuable contribution to the ongoing debate on reference. Each paper makes a significant contribution, opening interesting and, in some cases, new perspectives on classical topics in philosophy of language and mind.