Reference and Structure in the Philosophy of Language: A Defense of the Russellian Orthodoxy

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Arthur Sullivan, Reference and Structure in the Philosophy of Language: A Defense of the Russellian Orthodoxy, Routledge, 2013, 163pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415634007.

Reviewed by Francesco Orilia, University of Macerata, Italy


Following a tradition that has become well-entrenched in the last few decades, Arthur Sullivan distinguishes between denoting designators, such as definite descriptions, and (directly) referring designators such as proper names and indexicals. He also distinguishes structured designators, composed of proper parts that are individually meaningful, e.g., "the tallest spy," and unstructured designators, which do not have such proper parts, e.g., "Paris." He then proposes (p. 13) that all and only the referring designators are unstructured and all and only the denoting ones are structured. These two "central theses," claims Sullivan, are the essential ingredients of "the Russellian orthodoxy in the theory of reference,"[1] and this book is dedicated to refining and supporting them. Various positive reasons in their favor are offered, and basically all the prima facie ;counterexamples to them are dealt with. The whole discussion is strongly biased in favor of the currently dominant referentialist paradigm, according to which proper names, demonstratives, indexicals and (sometimes, in the appropriate context) even definite descriptions are referential. The rival descriptivist treatment of such terms, which was once more popular, is taken by Sullivan to be a dead end, despite recent attempts to revive it.[2] Nevertheless, both referentialists and descriptivists alike should agree that this is an agile and well-organized essay that in a short amount of space usefully reviews from the perspective of its main theme quite a bit of territory in current philosophy of language. It touches on issues such as semantics vs. metaphysics, rigid designation, kind terms, counterfactuals, complex demonstratives, the semantics/pragmatics divide, the dispute between literalists and contextualists.

Sullivan takes the referring/denoting distinction as exclusive and exhaustive[3] and characterizes it as follows (p. 11). Referring designators designate in a "relational" way, i.e., on the basis of a relation that semantically links the designatum to an utterance of the designator in such a way that the proposition expressed is object-dependent. (Here "object" is used in a wide sense so as to also cover kinds, both natural kinds such as gold and tigers and unnatural kinds such as bachelors). Paradigmatic examples are proper names, which are related to their designata by a historical-causal chain. Thus, for example, an utterance of "Obama is a president" expresses a proposition that depends for its existence on Obama in flesh and blood, since the appropriate historical-causal chain relates him to the token of "Obama" in question. Denoting designators do not make for the expression of object-dependent propositions and designate in a "satisfactional" way, in that, for an utterance of a denoting expression to be semantically linked to a designatum, a certain condition must be satisfied by the designatum in question. Paradigmatic examples are definite descriptions. Thus, for example, an utterance of "the tallest spy is Russian" expresses a proposition that exists even if there is no tallest spy, and "the tallest spy" designates the only object, if any, that happens to have the property of being taller than any other spy.

Sullivan not only treats as designators singular terms, but also general terms such as "cat," "bachelor" and "bald, happy human" (p. 131), which are taken to designate kinds (while refusing to make a commitment to a metaphysical theory of what kinds ultimately are). One may find it perplexing that "bald, happy human" is taken to be a referring expression, since it is clearly structured. But Sullivan explains that it does not count as a counterexample to his central theses, since it is a "Boolean referring expression," i.e., "the molecular output of a Boolean operation on three atomic referring expressions" (p. 131 n13). Be this as it may, it is not clear to me why this exempts an expression of this kind from being a counterexample to the central theses (given that it counts as a designator). But the important point is perhaps that Sullivan wants mainly to contrast proper names and demonstratives/indexicals on the one hand and definite descriptions on the other hand.

To be sure, following Russell,[4] Sullivan takes not just definite descriptions but all sorts of quantifier phrases, e.g., "every positive integer," "any man" and "some man," to be denoting designators (pp. 10, 12). But very little room is allocated to them in this book, and in particular a crucial issue such as what such designators denote is not addressed. While it is clear which object a definite description denotes, if it denotes, what about the other quantifier phrases? For instance, what do "any positive integer" and "no positive integer" denote?[5]

Whatever answer one may offer to these questions, it is arguable that quantifier phrases designate relationally appropriate designata, just as "bachelor" and "bald, happy human" designate relationally, by virtue of the conventions that govern their use, certain (non-natural) kinds or properties. Such designata are, one may say, the meanings of the expressions in question. As regards quantifier phrases, these meanings may be called, following Russell's terminology, denoting concepts (they are viewed by Richard Montague as sets of sets, but I think they are best seen, following Nino Cocchiarella, as properties of properties[6]). In other words, given Sullivan's use of "referring," denoting designators refer to denoting concepts. Thus, for example, "the tallest spy" refers to a certain denoting concept, a complex meaning somehow involving the meaning of "the" and the meaning of the general term "tallest spy," i.e., a certain property. If this property is uniquely exemplified by an individual, then "the tallest spy" denotes this individual. In sum, there is a sense in which denoting designators both refer and denote. All this may seem in tension with Sullivan's claim that the distinction between referring and denoting is exclusive, i.e., that no designator can both refer and denote (p. 114). But I think we simply need a more careful wording of the position that Sullivan wants to defend. I would put it roughly as follows: referring designators just refer, whereas denoting designators refer to denoting concepts and denote the objects, if any, satisfying those concepts. (How "satisfying" is to be understood needs refinement, given the diversity noted above within the class of denoting concepts.)

Let me now turn to the matter of how Sullivan treats the most blatant kind of potential counterexamples to his central theses, namely complex demonstratives (e.g., "that duck") and (allegedly) referential definite descriptions (e.g., a token of "the man drinking a martini," uttered in a situation such as that envisioned by Keith Donnellan in his famous paper on the attributive/referential distinction[7]). Following the dominant trend, Sullivan takes them to be referring designators in spite of being structured. In order to save the central theses, Sullivan then argues that they are "used in an unstructured way," in that, in using them, the speaker intends to express an object-dependent proposition and takes advantage of the general term following the demonstrative or determiner merely to make sure that the hearer picks up the right object. In particular, Sullivan approves of Eros Corazza's multiple proposition view (p. 104),[8] according to which in saying, e.g., "that duck is about to eat your sandwich," the speaker expresses two object-dependent propositions, thebackground one, involving a certain object qua attributed the property of being a duck, and the official one (the truth-conditionally relevant semantic meaning), involving that same object qua attributed the property of being about to eat the hearer's sandwich.

I think that, in embracing this position, Sullivan runs the risk of trivializing his central theses. For even if it is conceded that the proposition semantically expressed is object-dependent by virtue of the speaker's intention, it remains true that the semantic meaning of the general term embedded in the designator ("duck" in the above example) is exploited by the speaker and the hearer in determining the background proposition and thus it seems improper to say that the designator is used as unstructured. One may insist, as Sullivan does, that the semantic meaning of the general term is used at the pragmatic rather than at the semantic level. But the reason Sullivan offers for this is ultimately that the proposition semantically expressed by the utterance of the sentence involving the complex demonstrative is object-dependent. This is tantamount, in Sullivan's approach, to saying that such a demonstrative is referring rather than denoting. But then it seems as if it is true by definition that "unstructured" is a label for a referring term. The same problem arises, mutatis mutandis, for Sullivan's treatment of so-called referential definite descriptions. Of course, these issues are automatically sidestepped, if it is granted that complex demonstratives are denoting designators and definite descriptions are never referential. Unfortunately, Sullivan underestimates this option, even though it is perfectly viable, or at least so I think.[9]

[1] According to Sullivan (pp. 14-15), there are hints of them in Russell and David Kaplan, and they are explicitly endorsed by Stephen Neale and Joshua Dever.

[2] See F. Orilia, Singular Reference. A Descriptivist Perspective, Springer, Dordrecht, 2010, and references therein.

[3] He thus acknowledges (p. 25) that the two central theses are equivalent.

[4] Cf. B. Russell, “On Denoting,” Mind, 14 (1905), pp. 479-93, p. 479.

[5] The early Russell confronts such issues head on in Part I, Ch. 5 of The Principles of Mathematics (cf. G. Landini, Russell’s Hidden Substitutional Theory, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1988, Ch. 2). For Russell’s subsequent developments on these matters, see G. Landini, op. cit., Ch. 3, and Russell, Routledge, London and New York, 2011, pp. 143 ff.

[6] Cf. R. Montague, Formal Philosophy (R. Thomason, ed.), Yale University Press, New Haven, CT, 1974, and N. B. Cocchiarella, “Conceptualism, Realism and Intensional Logic”, Topoi, 5 (1989), pp. 75–87.

[7] K. Donnellan, “Reference and Definite Descriptions,” Philosophical Review, 75 (1966), pp. 281–304.

[8] See, e.g., E. Corazza, “Complex Demonstratives Qua Singular Terms,” Erkenntnis, 59 (2003), pp. 263-283.

[9]Cf. Orilia, op. cit., § 8.10.