Reference, Truth and Conceptual Schemes: A Defense of Internal Realism

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Forrai, Gabor, Reference, Truth and Conceptual Schemes: A Defense of Internal Realism, Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001, 160 pp, $49.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-792-36885-1.

Reviewed by Peter J. Graham, University of California, Riverside


Gábor Forrai has written a very clear and articulate defense of internal realism, the view that the categories and structures of the world are a function of our conceptual schemes. Internal realism is opposed to metaphysical realism, the view that the world’s structure is wholly independent, both causally and ontologically, of the human mind. For the metaphysical realist, the world is one thing and the mind is another. For the internal realist, on the other hand, though the world is causally independent of the human mind, the structure of the world – the individuals, kinds, and categories of the world—is a function of the human mind.

Internal realism is a fascinating view. It has its roots in the metaphysics of Kant, and its most important contemporary defender is Hilary Putnam. Strains of it can be found in the work of a number of other philosophers, both analytic and continental, perhaps most notably in the work of Richard Rorty. But it strikes many as counter-intuitive, contrary to common sense, and even absurd. An exposition and defense of the view in a book of moderate length that is both accessible to newcomers and advances the debate is thus a welcome contribution.

The book discusses a number of important and influential positions in the philosophy of language and mind, including Davidson against the very idea of conceptual scheme, Quine’s indeterminacy of reference doctrine, Tarski’s theory of truth, Dummett’s verificationism, Putnam’s model-theoretic argument and Twin Earth thought experiment, Kuhn on paradigm shifts, reference change, content externalism, skepticism, and relativism. In the course of the argument of the book, Forrai also develops a novel approach to conceptual schemes, an approach that, as Forrai successfully argues, avoids Davidson’s arguments against what Davidson, among others, calls conceptual schemes.

Argumentatively there are two main aspects to the book. The first concerns objectivity and relativism, the second concerns reference, truth, and skepticism. I found what Forrai has to say in the first part interesting and worthwhile, and philosophers attracted to internal realism but concerned about both objectivity and relativism could profit from studying what Forrai has to say. But I’m not convinced that Forrai’s discussion of reference and skepticism constitutes an adequate case against the metaphysical realist. In the rest of this review, I’ll briefly sketch what Forrai has to say about objectivity and relativism, and then go on to discuss the debate between the metaphysical realist and the internal realist over reference and truth.

The problem of objectivity for the internal realist is this. There seem to be cases where a community gets things wrong; we sometimes misclassify things. Forrai imagines a group that classifies certain antelopes as zebras. This looks like an error. The community has failed to get the structure of reality right. But if internal realism is true, reality is a function of our classifications; there can be no such thing as misclassification. Reality becomes subjective.

Forrai’s solution is to distinguish adequate from inadequate conceptual schemes. A conceptual scheme, for Forrai, is a device for coping with a causally independent world, a world that, though not intrinsically structured, is nevertheless given to us; it constrains what counts as a successful or adequate way of carving up the world. Schemes are devices for coping with the world, and some will prove to be better than others. Inadequate schemes, for Forrai, are those that fail to prove as good as others at meeting the needs for which they were designed. When the imagined community notices the distinction between zebras and antelopes, they give up their scheme. Or even if they don’t, since we make the distinction, we see that there is a better scheme. What the imagined community refers to, Forrai claims, are not zebras and antelopes by the term ‘zebra’, but rather just zebras, and hence it follows that when they classify antelopes as zebras they are making a mistake. And all of this is compatible with internal realism, for whether something is a zebra or not is still a function of the human mind, a function of an adequate conceptual scheme. Misclassification is due to inadequacy.

Part of Forrai’s account of what makes a scheme adequate is that the practice it serves be choiceworthy. Choiceworthiness depends upon two things. First, whether the goal of the practice is worth pursuing, and second, whether the practice coheres with other practices. A problem Forrai sees for this account is that it may imply relativism, for whether a practice is choiceworthy, and so whether a scheme is adequate, may vary relative to the set of other background practices that it is compared with for coherence. Adequacy, and so truth and reality, may be relative to complete sets of practices, that is, to cultures. Cultural relativism is thus waiting in the wings. But Forrai notes that it all depends on whether cultures are really disjoint, whether they fail to have practices in common. It all depends, that is, on whether cultural relativism is true. This is an important point. Internal realism, unlike metaphysical realism, may not block the truth of relativism, but it does not entail it.

I now turn to the debate between the internal realist and the metaphysical realist over reference and skepticism, over whether the world is independent of the mind.

Forrai’s first important move is to defuse the argument that internal realism cannot be true because our common-sense framework has it that the world is independent of the human mind. Though Forrai agrees that this is how the folk would have it, and also agrees that any metaphysics must conform to it, what the folk believes is ambiguous between two readings of independence: causally versus ontologically independent. Qualifications aside, the first is clearly true. The world is there whether we are or not. And the internal realist agrees; the view is not a crude idealism. But the second is not so obviously true. Though many of us believe it, and may find it very hard to give up, it may turn out that it is false. Here is the debate between the internal realist and the metaphysical realist. Do we have good reason to prefer the former answer over the latter?

A central question of twentieth-century Anglo-American philosophy is how language hooks up to reality. For some, it is the problem of the twentieth century. Forrai’s central motivation for preferring internal realism over metaphysical realism is that the latter seems unable to answer this question. According to the metaphysical realist, our concepts and categories refer by appropriately matching or mirroring the real kinds, boundaries, and structures that are fixed by the world, fixed wholly independently of our concepts. They are there before we are, and so they are what they are before we come along and start carving things up. When we successfully refer that is because our efforts at carving the world up match the way the world has done it on its own. But then Forrai wonders, if our carving and the world’s carving are two separate things, how does it happen that our concepts match the world? Forrai puts this in terms of an analogy: suppose there is a two-level cake. Both layers are divided into slices. The lower level is the ontologically mind-independent structure of the real world, and the upper is the mind-dependent carving, a carving that is the result of our conceptualizations. Why should the top layer, Forrai asks, match the bottom layer? Although it is possible that they match, it seems very unlikely, Forrai says, that they will. Indeed, Forrai says it would be something like a miracle if our concepts should map onto entities that are ontologically independent of the mind. The solution the internal realist offers is to suppose that the slicing of the lower layer of cake is a function of the slicing at the higher level. It would thus not be a surprise if the two matched up. Reference simply falls out of category constitution and the individuation of objects.

The problem of reference asks something like this, “How do parts of sentences hook up to the world?” And the way Forrai understands the question, it has to turn out that some of our words do in fact refer to, or hook up with, the world. Reference presupposes successful reference, or, in other words, for certain expressions to be meaningful, to purport to refer, some of them (all of them?) must genuinely refer. Some simple sentences are thus bound to be true. But now Forrai’s answer to the problem of reference can be used to refute a kind of skepticism. Global skepticism asserts the possibility that we might be wholly cut off from the world, that everything (more or less) that we believe might be false. But if reference is a function of successful reference, and truth, à la Tarksi, is a function of reference, then a good number, though perhaps not most or even many, of our beliefs must be true. Global skepticism is thereby undermined. And this, Forrai thinks, is another (or maybe just an extension of the same) virtue of internal realism, for it is not a move available to the metaphysical realist.

One can thus see why internal realism might be an attractive view. But it might be attractive not so much on its own merits, but rather in virtue of being an alternative to an otherwise unattractive theory. Forrai does not, I think, spend enough effort trying to motivate internal realism as a plausible view independently of alleged defects in metaphysical realism. Without additional reasons in favor of internal realism, it might be possible for the metaphysical realist to hold onto her position with certain emendations, emendations that do not alter the fundamental character of the view. And I think there are at least two things the metaphysical realist can say to answer the question of how the mind connects to the world, where both involve the causal interaction of the world with the mind. What I have in mind are scientific realism and content externalism.

The scientific realist says that the best explanation of the success of science is that its categories and concepts match up, or at least approximately match up, to the real structure of the world. Scientific realism sees the progress of science as something like evolution. Species that hang around fit their environments, even if, ontologically, they are distinct from their environments. Likewise, the scientific realist supposes that the best explanation for why our theories work, theories that are ontologically independent of the world they are about, is because they are not causally independent of the world. Similar moves can be made to talk about our words, concepts, or conceptual schemes, moves that can be, and have been, made in reply to the global skeptic. Though our thoughts are ontologically independent of the world, we believe what we do because a lot of them turn out to be true, and their being true is what explains why we are able to navigate a world whose causal impact on us never ceases. Now, it should be stressed, none of this implies that we can get out of our minds and directly compare the way the world is with what we believe and see if they match. None of this implies that we can take up the God’s eye point of view and see whether the world is the way we believe it to be, even if, as Forrai and others have suggested, metaphysical realism implies the possibility of such a point of view. Rather what it implies is that the way the world is just might explain the way our minds are, even if the relationship between the two is contingent, and not, as the internal realist would have it, necessary. Causation might be just what the metaphysical realist needs to rebut internal realist objections. Causation can explain successful reference and also, possibly, rebut the global skeptic.

I think Forrai, and others attracted to internal realism, would probably think that the appeal to causation just sketched does not really eliminate the worry that on the metaphysical realist view the successful matching of mind and world looks like a miracle. As for me, I think it certainly undermines the thought that it must be a miracle. After all, it may seem a miracle that humans exist with such complex organs and so on. But once we see that we evolved over many centuries it might not be so hard to see that complexity might just arise in a non-miraculous fashion. If we are causally embedded in a world, it shouldn’t be a surprise that we succeed in referring to the world. (The argument may not prove metaphysical realism and thereby refute internal realism, but that is another matter.) But be this as it may, is there something stronger that the metaphysical realist might appeal to? I think there is, and again causation is involved. But this time instead of causation between mind and world simply preferring or selecting one set of concepts to another, causation between mind and world will constitute or individuate our concepts. What I have in mind is content externalism.

According to content externalism, put rather crudely, the world ontologically, and not just causally, (at least partially) determines the mind. Content externalism has it that the world is ontologically independent of the mind; its structures and categories are there well before our arrival on the scene. The mind, however, is not so ontologically independent: the concepts that populate the mind, or at least the simple concepts that compose the parts of many other concepts, are the result of causal interaction with the world, either through evolution, learning, or both. We wouldn’t have concepts for certain shapes and colors, certain sounds and smells, certain edibles and predators, unless we causally interacted with those things. Here the world determines the mind. Such a view can be found in the work of Hilary Putnam, Tyler Burge, Fred Dretske, Ruth Millikan, Jerry Fodor, and others. Content externalism, as I see it, is the mirror image of internal realism. According to internal realism, the mind is somehow or other ontologically fixed independently of the world, and then the world derives its nature and structure from the mind. The content externalist reverses the order of explanation. The world is somehow or other ontologically fixed independently of the mind, and then the mind derives a number of its concepts and categories from its causal interaction with the world. And, like the internal realist, the content externalist says it is neither a mystery why many of our concepts should refer to the world, nor is it possible that all of our judgments should turn out to be false. The problem of reference is solved, and the global skeptic is refuted. Of course all of this is put crudely and sloppily, and content externalists do not agree on a number of important details. But the point, I hope, is clear enough.

Is content externalism compatible with metaphysical realism? I think the answer is yes, insofar as what is central to metaphysical realism is the idea that the structure of the world is ontologically independent of us. And content externalists seem to think it is compatible. Milikan, in fact, has argued in print that it is, and other well-known externalists have told me in conversation that they think it must be. And if it is compatible, then it does not seem that the problems of reference and skepticism motivate the rejection of metaphysical realism in favor of internal realism. Forrai may be right that there must be some individuative connection between mind and world, but it does not seem to me that Forrai has offered any reason to suppose it should go in the mind-to-world direction, the internal-realist direction, and not in the world-to-mind direction. Indeed, if there is a real weakness of the book, it is the failure to see this possibility. When Forrai does discuss content externalism, it consists in either trying to show that Fodor’s version is not terribly plausible (with which I whole-heartedly agree; Fodor’s view is not, I think, representative) or in trying to show that content externalism is compatible with internal realism (which seems strange; if the world determines the mind, then why should the mind determine the world?). Now whether or not Fodor’s view is any good, and whether or not externalism is compatible with internal realism, what really matters is whether or not content externalism undermines the rationale for internal realism in that it provides a way out for the metaphysical realist, a possibility that Forrai, I think, has missed.

There are, then, at least two possible ways out for the metaphysical realist, and Forrai is not, I think, sufficiently convincing when responding to the first, scientific realist kind of answer, and completely misses the force of the second.

Forrai’s book is very well organized and covers a great deal of material in contemporary metaphysics and epistemology. It’s a very useful treatment of the debate between the internal realist and the metaphysical realist, and the account of conceptual schemes and their adequacy is a welcome contribution. The book falls within the recent resurgence of pragmatist thinking on number of central issues in philosophy including reference, truth, knowledge and justification. Though I am generally sympathetic to pragmatism, especially about questions of justification and rationality, I’m not sure the best way to advance the pragmatist cause is to give up on the traditional metaphysical realist account of objectivity and independence.