Reference without Referents

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Mark Sainsbury, Reference without Referents, Oxford University Press, 2005, 280pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199241805.

Reviewed by Stephen Barker, University of Nottingham


Sainsbury offers a sophisticated, lucid, elegantly written defense of a theory of referring terms dubbed RWR, for Reference without Referents. The core idea of RWR is the adoption of a negative free logic within a Davidsonian truth-theoretic framework, in which the meaning of terms is given by reference axioms that do not imply that referring terms have referents. Just as we do not require a sentence to be true to be meaningful, we should not expect referring terms to refer to be meaningful. Rather we require them to have reference conditions. RWR is meant to stake out a position intermediate between Russellian, Direct Reference theorists, according to whom names essentially denote and meaning is in the referent, and Fregean, Descriptivist theories, according to which meaning is sense -- understood descriptively or non-descriptively. The book seeks to articulate the advantages of RWR, focusing on proper names, indefinite descriptions, definite descriptions, pronouns, plurals, and pre-linguistic cognitive underpinnings.

The first chapter offers an interesting scene setting, tracing out the main currents of thought on reference. Sainsbury's RWR is then presented in these terms (45-6): (1) There are singular and plural referring terms. (2) Referring terms can be simple (mostly names) and complex (descriptions). (3) There are empty intelligible referring terms. (4) Truth-valued sentences can have empty terms -- for example negative existentials. (5) Semantic theory is governed by negative free logic. (6) Reference is not world-relative. (7) Referring expressions are rigid and form a uniform category. (8) If a singular referring term refers to x and y then x = y. (9) Meaning theory assigns axioms to referring terms of the form: For all x, 'N' denotes x iff x is N. (10) Semantic theories are (ideally) homophonic. (11) Co-referring terms can have distinct reference conditions. (12) Ockhamist truth-conditions are assigned to subject-predicate sentences S-P. That is, 'S-P' is true iff S has a unique referent which satisfies P and is false otherwise.

Chapter 2 outlines the semantic framework in which the theses are embedded. Its foundation is a truth-theoretic approach to meaning of the kind honed by Davidson and McDowell. Truth-theory is meant to have two merits -- 'it deflates semantic ambition and it helps restrain ad hoc proposals' (47). The deflation of ambition is a theory of meaning in the form of a truth-theory for a language fitting into an overall theory of speakers' psychology. Such a theory delivers T-sentences,

'S' is true iff P

from which can be derived reports of what speakers say in uttering 'S'. (So a theory of meaning is an attempt to axiomatise saying-attributions.) There is no attempt to analyze what speakers' understanding is constituted by, or word-meaning. Rather, the emphasis is on explaining compositionally complex sentences in terms of parts. One might talk weakly of an interpretive truth-theory being something knowledge of which would suffice for understanding the language -- but such a claim seems to have little theoretical interest, as Sainsbury seems to acknowledge.

The ideal form for truth-theories is homophonic, since the best way to say what someone means is through the sentence itself. This is challenged by indexicality -- as is well known. Sainsbury's response is to favor conditional truth-condition attributions and reports that have a scene-form structure (55). Thus, for a sentence featuring a demonstrative, That is cool, we have:

For all x, if in uttering 'That is cool' the speaker used 'that' to refer to x, then her utterance is true iff x is cool.

From this, along with other axioms, reports of the form below can be derived (158-163):

Using 'that' to refer to Blue Poles, John said that it was cool.

Not quite homophony but as close as we can get.

Sainsbury's framework involves marrying truth-theoretic semantics to free logic, which, unlike classical logical, allows referring terms to lack denotations. Thus in classical logic the following are valid:

x x = a x(Fx v ¬Fx)

If we allow empty terms we do not want to accept: ∃x x = Pegasus. Similarly, if there were nothing, all names were empty, the second would be false. Quantifier-rules -- both universal instantiation and existential generalization -- need modification. There are three kinds of free logic: positive -- according to which sentences like 'Vulcan is Vulcan' are true; Fregean free logic -- according to which all sentences with empty terms are truth-valueless; and negative free logic (NFL) -- according to which simple sentences with empty referring terms are false. Sainsbury argues for the latter, and thereby embraces his Ockhamist truth-conditions for simple sentences.

NFL does not seem to perfectly match natural language intuitions. For example, treating definite descriptions as referential, one might allow that where there is no marsupial native to England, we can assert that this is false: The marsupial native to England is furry. But, knowing that Australia is full of marsupials, do we judge this false: The marsupial native to Australia is furry? Here the description fails to denote because of uniqueness failure rather than non-existence, and the judgement of falsity seems inappropriate.

Sainsbury uses NFL in RWR to provide a theory of names (73), employing the reference conditions idea. Truth theories assign reference axioms to 'Vulcan' as in:

for all x ('Vulcan' refers to x iff x is Vulcan)

Given classical logic this implies "'Vulcan' refers to Vulcan", which must be false in NFL. For Sainsbury, referring terms are rigid designators -- though the argument for that thesis is not entirely clear (79).

In chapter 3, Sainsbury sets out to do justice to the intelligibility of empty names. Four cases of empty names are discussed: Names involved in existence disputes ('Homer'); names used by some past or present population in the mistaken belief that they were non-empty ('Vulcan'); names of things which no longer exist ('Aristotle'); and fictional names. He dispatches the following arguments against empty names: 'Names name' is necessary and analytic; an expression not owing its intelligibility to a description can only owe it to an object; the function of referring expressions is to introduce objects; understanding is object related and so is impossible without an object.

Sainsbury considers alternatives to RWR that attempt to maintain that: (i) apparently empty names really pick out fictional entities or abstract entities; (ii) empty names are not really intelligible; (iii) apparently empty names are intelligible but not really names -- they are descriptions. (i) is dismissed as ontologically unacceptable -- though some discussion is given over to fictional entities in chapter 6. (ii), a view associated with Evans and McDowell, is convincingly dealt with. (iii) is presented with a dilemma (102). Either the proposed descriptions are inconstant across the population using the putative name, and so publicity is lost, or some metalinguistic description is required which is too sophisticated to be attributed to speakers. (We might also add that if two distinct empty names have the same phono-graphemic form -- say, both are 'Pegasus' -- then the approach will fail to achieve publicity by treating them as the same public name.)

There is more to names than simply the axioms that fix their meaning. There is also the name-using practice. In chapter 3, Sainsbury provides a theory of baptism, initiation into a language using practice and transmission. He argues that name-using practices are essentially tied to a particular referent or are essentially empty. He claims, as he must, that his characterization covers both denoting and empty name-using practice. But one doubts that he does this. Baptism looks unproblematic enough in that Sainsbury does provide some explanation of empty baptism. Initiation is more problematic. Sainsbury claims (113) that a new user has an intention like:

12. For all x, if the uses of NN I am now encountering refer to x, then I will use NN to refer to x.

Later (116) he seems to interpret initiation in these terms: 'all I need for initiation is to acquire the disposition to use the name with a speaker referent that aligns with its semantic referent'. That does not obviously work for empty cases. Later still Sainsbury says (122), harkening back to 12, that since there is no referent for the term there is no issue of failing to be in accord. But that again seems deficient.

It also strikes me that no account of name-using practice can be adequate unless it gives an account of what uttering a term as a name is. But that is the very thing that Sainsbury steps back from providing.

Chapter 4 covers so-called unbound anaphora, as found in texts like:

A mosquito is buzzing around our room. It is keeping me awake.

The pronoun it is not in the syntactic scope of a mosquito, assuming that the later is an existential quantifier. Sainsbury argues (130) that indefinites are not referring terms, based in discourse like:

A: A mosquito is buzzing around our room.

B: Yes. I can hear it too.

A: In fact, there are hundreds of them.

The key contention is that A's first sentence does not depend on picking out any particular mosquito in the multitude. This is not a terribly convincing argument -- see Barker (Renewing Meaning, OUP, 2004) for a theory according to which all indefinites function as referring terms, and a resulting huge simplification of anaphora.

Given the existential treatment, Sainsbury provides a theory of such anaphora based on Evans' e-type approach. The resulting theory is rather elaborate but interesting (141). The semantic interpretation of a mosquito -- being an existential quantifier -- does not furnish us with material sufficient to interpret the pronoun, so Sainsbury postulates that it is part of the correct semantic-pragmatic interpretation of such phrases that they are associated with individual concepts (see 146). Individual concepts are elaborated in some detail in chapter 7. What is odd here is that individual concepts are never meant to function purely descriptively. But clearly some anaphors like:

A person must have invented the zipper. He/she must have got rich.

will involve only descriptive modes of reference.

Sainsbury turns to complex referring expressions in chapter 5. He examines plural names and descriptions. Plurals do not denote an irreducible plurality, nor a set, nor a mereological fusion of individuals. On the other hand, Sainsbury tells us that 'the Apostles' does not denote Matthew and does not denote John, etc. It denotes Matthew and John and Peter, etc. The reason given for rejecting the latter view is in the form of a reductio: if a term N denotes an object O, then truth-conditions for sentences (N___) are specified in terms of O. So plurals cannot denote the individuals. Our worry that plurals do not denote strange pluralities is not necessarily allayed by this, and we might resist the argument for it by urging the weaker principle: If N denotes O only, and nothing else, then the truth-conditions for (N___) are specified in terms of O. And one might attempt to maintain the view that plurals like the Apostles simultaneously denote each individual.

Sainsbury provides a largely referential treatment of definite descriptions. Broadly definite descriptions have reference axioms of the form:

for all x ('the F' refers to x iff x alone satisfies F)

Russell is driven to the view that definite descriptions are quantifiers because (a) there are empty intelligible definite descriptions, and (b) referring terms must denote. Sainsbury rejects (b) in this argument. Sainsbury, however, does not think that all definite descriptions denote. He allows that both Donnellan's referential and attributive uses are referring terms (188-91), but contends (187) that some definite descriptions do not function as referring terms -- cases like:

The first man in space might have been an American.

In this case, the speaker cannot be said to have a referential intention. But why does it follow from that that the term concerned is not a referring term, since many referring terms are used without referential intentions?

Existence and fiction are discussed in chapter 6. Sainsbury's treatment of fiction deftly applies the distinction between truth and fidelity to a fiction in unraveling various puzzles. The treatment of existence brings in troubling issues of scope. Sainsbury affirms that all instances of Vulcan is non-existent are necessarily false (197). This is odd -- such sentences look assertable -- but there are reasons for this view, though Sainsbury does not make them explicit. Take Caesar is non-existent. One might think this is contingently false. By existential generalization, it entails x(x is non-existent). The latter is necessarily false, according to Sainsbury, since there is no quantification over non-existing entities -- see 200. But that implies that the former, Caesar is non-existent, is necessarily false. If so, no instance of N is non-existent is true. But is it so obvious that Vulcan is non-existent is false? I think not. It would seem then that there is some pressure on the rejection of non-existent entities.

Chapter 7 develops a theory of pre-linguistic reference and individual concepts, qua elements of individuals' psychology. According to the latter theory, individual concepts, when they denote, track objects not through informational adequacy, but through causal-perception based connections. No information, encoded in predicates, is essential to any individual concepts (240). The theory is rich and nuanced, covering such issues as recognition, discriminatory knowledge, and sortals. But there is an oddness within the context of RWR as developed by Sainsbury. Sainsbury says that there are no individual concepts that function purely descriptively. But we have seen (i) that for his treatment of pronouns anaphoric on indefinite descriptions that they will have to be descriptive individual concepts; (ii) He treats attributive uses of definite descriptions as referring terms. Presumably, definite descriptions used referentially in this way require intentions -- linguistic reference requires pre-linguistic reference (217). But intentions require prior concepts in some sense. Why are these not descriptive individual concepts?

The right structure of pre-linguistic concepts allowing denotation and truth-apt thought may sit ill with the truth-theoretic austere approach to meaning. And while the book is a fascinating read, Sainsbury's contention that RWR is the only kind of theory to do justice to empty referring terms is false. See Barker (2004) for a completely different pragmatic, speech-act theoretic approach.