Referring to the World: An Opinionated Introduction to the Theory of Reference

Referring To The World An Opinionated Introduction To The Theory Of Reference

Kenneth A. Taylor, Referring to the World: An Opinionated Introduction to the Theory of Reference. Oxford University Press, 2021, 297pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195144741.

Reviewed by Mark Sainsbury, The University of Texas at Austin


notre dame philosophical reviews

Kenneth A. Taylor, Referring to the World: An Opinionated Introduction to the Theory of Reference. Oxford University Press, 2021, 297pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195144741.

Reviewed by Mark Sainsbury, The University of Texas at Austin

In a moving Foreword to this book, friends and colleagues of Kenneth Taylor tell us that on the day of his death in December 2019, he announced on Facebook that the book “finally existed in an almost complete draft”. All that remained, he said, was some tidying up and the provision of a concluding chapter. The resulting volume does not seem untidy or incomplete. It forcefully marshals a range of significant arguments concerning the nature of reference, under the umbrella of “two-factor referentialism”. This is shaped by an overarching distinction between what he calls the “merely objectual” and the “fully objective”. Successful reference is fully objective. But a representational vehicle may be fit for having an objective referent, and thus “objectual”, without succeeding in referring, that is, without being fully objective:

a fully objective representation is one that actually stands for a real existent or expresses a real property. A merely objectual representation, on the other hand, is one that is “fit” or “ready” for the job of standing for a real existent or expressing a real property, even though that representation may not yet do so. . . . [These two] distinct but cooperating factors . . . work jointly to constitute reference. . . . (18–19)

One factor in two-factor representationalism consists in the objectual facts, which make room for reference to apparently non-existent things, like fictional and mythical beings, and reference to abstract objects. The other factor consists in the objective facts, and in these cases we have genuinely relational reference: where there is objective reference, there is a referent. Taylor traces this distinction, or forerunners of it, back to Kant (49–50) and Frege (50–1).

The two factors bear a close relation, as Taylor himself says, to the distinction between syntactic features (which deliver objectuality) and semantic features (which in the good cases deliver objectivity); or more generally between a representational vehicle and its content. There are also echoes of Quine’s distinction between purported reference and reference. The distinction plays its most conspicuous role in the final chapter, entitled “The things we do with empty names”.[1] It is widely agreed that empty names have what Taylor calls objectuality; that is, they are, or purport to be, referring expressions. What is disputed is whether they also have what he would call objectivity; that is, whether the purportedly referring expressions have referents. In the case of fiction, Taylor comes down firmly on the irrealist side: “There are typically no objects we are talking about when we deploy fictional names in fictional contexts. . . . fictional names typically have no referents at all” (262, 264).

On the other hand, he feels the need to do justice to notions of apparent coreference in fictional contexts. There’s a good sense in which all of Shakespeare, Taylor, and the readers of this book talk about the same thing when using “Hamlet”: it is natural to say that we all refer to Hamlet. To make room for such phenomena, Taylor introduces the idea of “notional objects”. These “are not genuine objects. They are nothing but pleonastic reifications of relations of intrinsic and extrinsic purport of coreference” (263). More extreme irrealists would prefer not to countenance even pleonastic reifications in the metaphysics of fiction.

Taylor asks what we are to make of such seemingly singular beliefs as that Pegasus can fly. He answers that the corresponding sentences are “singular in form but not in content”, and finds himself committed to the view that they express no proposition, and so nothing that could be believed: “Strictly speaking, that Pegasus can fly is incredible” (274). He recognizes that this is a bullet-biting view, and he tries to make it more digestible by allowing that the form is singular even though, as there is no content, there is no singular content. However, if there are notional objects, as he envisages, one of these might be a candidate for being the referent of “Pegasus”, and so making possible a belief to the effect that Pegasus can fly. And even if “Pegasus” has no referent, it does not directly follow that a sentence like “Pegasus can fly” expresses no proposition. If one thinks that a subject-predicate sentence is true just if the subject refers to something that satisfies the predicate, and is otherwise false, “Pegasus can fly” expresses a false belief.

Remarkably, he takes it that there are no numbers, so the whole of pure mathematics fails to be objective (in his sense). If there are no Pegasus beliefs because “Pegasus” doesn’t refer, there are no numerical beliefs, for, on his view, numerals do not refer. The radical character of this view is presumably intended to be somewhat alleviated by his claim that

when we engage in pure . . . mathematics, we are playing a non-veridical language-game, deploying merely objectual, rather than fully objective representations and . . . our governing concern is not a species of strict, literal truth but a species of truth-similitude. . . . (255)

Although he is not entirely explicit, truth-similitude seems to be truth in a fiction. Taylor does not tell us who wrote the mathematical fiction, how it might have been developed differently, or how a fiction can help with the building of non-fictional bridges.

He takes issue with several Fregean views. For example, he challenges the common assumption that Frege thought one could establish the need for sense on the basis of puzzles about difference of cognitive value between identity sentences. The puzzles require for their resolution two things meeting this condition: one can know what each refers to without knowing that they refer to the same, even if they in fact do so. Frege says only that “it is natural” (“Es liegt nun nahe”), not that it is mandatory, to appeal to senses as candidates for meeting this condition. Taylor in effect points out that names will serve just as well as senses, for they meet the critical condition. One can understand two names which corefer without knowing that they corefer, and hence one could be ignorant of the truth of a true identity sentence which one understands if it involves two names. Since the metaphysics of names is a good deal clearer than that of senses, this constitutes an improvement over Frege’s position, so far as identity puzzles go. And Taylor provides several examples of ways in which the straightforward application of Fregean sense to attitude attributions fails to do them justice.[2]

Frege held that propositional attitudes are relations between a subject and a thought, a structure of senses. This suggests that all correct attributions of propositional attitudes are de dicto: they should just specify the subject’s thought, and in so doing the attributer makes none of the commitments attributed to the thinker. By contrast, Taylor undertakes to “argue that garden variety attitude ascriptions . . . have more in common with so-called de re ascriptions than they do with so-called de dicto ascriptions” (183).

Taylor’s approach has a striking structural feature. He begins by showing how the use of a slur in the scope of an attitude attribution is the responsibility of the attributor, whereas on Fregean views it ought to be quarantined within the part of the sentence that is intended merely to display the attributee’s thought. He goes on to apply the same moral to very different cases: uses of definite descriptions within the scope of an attribution for which the attributor cannot shift the responsibility on to the attributee.

In Taylor’s example relating to slurs, Smith sincerely utters “[N-word in the plural] make poor baseball players” (187).[3] If Jones reports this by saying “Smith believes that [N-word in the plural] make poor baseball players”, Jones does not escape the opprobrium of using a slur, despite the fact that the offensive word is in de dicto position, a position in which, for the Fregean, words express only features of Smith’s mental state, not Jones’s. This seems to me a decisive point.

Taylor claims that a parallel point applies to some uses of definite descriptions. Suppose that, at a party, Jones mistakenly believes, concerning a man drinking martinis, that it is a woman drinking gimlets, and says: “The woman in the corner drinking gimlets has had too much to drink” (195). Smith, who knows all the facts, cannot correctly report what Jones believes, in sincerely uttering the sentence just displayed, by using Smith’s incorrect definite description “Jones believes that the woman in the corner drinking gimlets has had too much to drink” (195). For that would commit Smith, wrongly, to taking Jones’s belief to relate to a gimlet-drinking woman. This is a subtle point that standard Fregeans would find difficult to address.

Taylor suggests that the phenomenon is less common when we turn to predicative positions. He says that one who assertively utters “Jones believes that Wanda is a bitch” (198) does not use “bitch” to derogate. But there are plenty of examples in which an attributer can escape commitment to an attributed predicate. A simple example, very much the tip of an iceberg: “She thought it was a rabbit; but it was a hare”. The attributor obviously is not committed, just on the basis of this report, to anything being a rabbit.

In this book, Taylor extends and elaborates many themes from his earlier work, presenting them with verve and gusto. It is a worthy finale to a rich and imaginative life’s work in philosophy.


Taylor, Kenneth. (2002). “De re and de dicto: against the conventional wisdom.” Philosophical Perspectives, 16, 225–265.

Taylor, Kenneth. (2014). "The Things We Do With Empty Names: Objectual Representations, Non-Veridical Language Games, and Truth Similitude.” In Manuel Garcia-Carpintero and Genoveva Martí (eds), Empty Representations: Reference and Non-Existence. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 183–214.


[1] This is an extended version of his paper of the same title, which appeared in Manuel Garcia-Carpintero and Genoveva Martí (eds), Empty Representations: Reference and Non-Existence (2014).

[2] Many of them follow closely the discussion in his “De re and de dicto: against the conventional wisdom” (2002).

[3] Taylor himself spells out the N-word in full.