Reflections on Aristotle's Politics

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Mogens Herman Hansen, Reflections on Aristotle's Politics, Museum Tusculanum Press, 2013, 127pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9788763540629.

Reviewed by Jean Roberts, University of Washington


This is a collection of eight concise and lucid papers on Aristotle's Politics by the eminent historian Mogens Herman Hansen. The author's intimate familiarity with Aristotle's text, as well as his unparalleled knowledge of Greek political history are on full display throughout. The pieces do, nevertheless, differ individually in aim and scope, thereby providing a nice display of the range of scholarly abilities needed in making anything like complete sense of this difficult text. On the other hand, since the ordering of the pieces in the volume, all of which except the last were previously published, appears to be chronological, the differences in type from one piece to the next, as well as random cross-references, can be a bit disorienting. There seems no particular reason to read in the order presented.

At one end of the scale are two small pieces (the third and fourth in the volume) that analyze the difficulties in translating a couple of key passages. The first of these, "Polis, Politeuma, and Politeia: A Note on Arist. Pol. 1278b6-14", takes off from the description of the politeia (usually, "constitution") that opens III, 6, plausibly offers "polity" as a way of letting politeia range, as Aristotle's usage does, from the abstract citizen-structure (hence the standard "constitution") to something much more concrete like "body of citizens". The second, "Aristotle's Definition of Polis at Pol. 1276b1-2", reminds us that a noun, in this case koinōnia, "community" or "participation", can have both a subjective and an objective genitive depending on it, even when English has trouble capturing the sense.

A few other pieces seem of primarily historical interest. The fifth chapter, "Aristotle's Reference to the Arkadian Federation at Pol. 1261a29", argues that, although Aristotle does in this one place refer to a federation of cities in the Politics, and although such federations were common at the time he was writing, the fact that he does not discuss them shows how serious he is about the polis as the perfect and complete form of human community, and hence as the only appropriate subject matter for political science. As an earlier chapter ("Aristotle's Two Complementary Views of the Greek Polis") mentions, this view of Aristotle's about the centrality of the polis has had the unfortunate consequence of making historians think erroneously that the independent polis was the predominant form of political community prior to the second half of the 4th Century. The following chapter, aptly named "A Pedestrian Synopsis of Aristotle's Best Polis in Pol. 7-8", likewise mainly reveals the author's expertise in ancient constitutional forms, an inventory of which is used as the framework for describing Aristotle's ideal city here.

The final piece, "Aspects of Indirect Democracy in Ancient Greece, in Particular in Aristotle's Politics", also establishes important historical connections, but raises some difficult theoretical questions as well. Here Hansen argues that, although, as is well known, no ancient democratic polis had representative institutions, the idea of representation appears briefly in the Politics in VI,3. Aristotle there describes a mixed constitution in which conflict between the rich and the poor is mitigated by having decisions made by a body composed of equal numbers from each group. Aristotle does explicitly introduce the notion of the two groups reaching a compromise in their understanding of justice and equality, but the extent to which he might or might not have imagined that as happening by way of a specifically representative mechanism is unclear. Hansen is on firm ground though in pointing to Aristotle's preference for a kind of mixed arrangement in which the people elect their betters to office but also formally hold them to account, which one might well describe as indirect, if not representative, democracy.

The first two chapters, "Aristotle's Alternative to the Sixfold Model of Constitutions" and "Aristotle's Two Complementary Views of the Greek Polis", cover ground that will be familiar to philosophers. The first begins by reminding the reader that the familiar division of constitutions, usually attributed to Aristotle, by number of rulers (one, few, many) and then by whether those who rule do so in their own interest or in that of the ruled, in fact originates with Xenophon and Plato. Aristotle's real contribution to the task of categorizing constitutions comes in the "empirical" books when he takes all constitutions as varieties of democracy and oligarchy, and finds four kinds of each, with an additional and particularly well mixed version of the two emerging as a relative ideal. Hansen then goes on to suggest that this revised model allows Aristotle to solve two problems the old one didn't allow him to. The first is the question about how to classify a city ruled by a majority of wealthy people or by a minority of poor people, neither, as Aristotle points out, at all typical or likely, democracies generally being ruled by the many who are poor and oligarchies by the few who are wealthy. It is true that introducing different versions of democracy and oligarchy will make space for poor minorities and wealthy majorities. This doesn't establish though that this was felt as such a problem by Aristotle that any conceptual moves were required to deal with it. Even if so, why is this an alternative model rather than a further specification within the original model fashioned to deal with knotty questions of application to real cities? Aristotle frequently begins with familiar and sharply drawn categories and then carefully muddles them as he proceeds to look more carefully and subtly at a question.

The second advantage Hansen finds in the alternative model seems positively contrived. The suggestion is that Aristotle's ethics requires that everything good be a mean between an excess and a defect. Aristotle's politics is supposed to be of a piece with his ethics, and so the best constitution should be a mean between two extremes. There is no room for such a schema on the traditional sixfold model; there is on the alternative one. This is not the place to complain about the over-reading of the doctrine of the mean as a part of Aristotelian moral and political theory. Suffice to say that it is introduced as a general description of virtue of character in humans. It is only a general description; it does not indicate in any useful way what good action or character consists in, merely that it will be the right amount, in varying senses of "amount", of various things related to the virtue in question, rather than too much or too little of those various factors. In any case, justice, the virtue of cities and their rulers, does not lie in a mean. Moreover, however relatively good the mixed constitution that emerges from the discussion of democracy and oligarchy is, it is far from clear that it is identical to the ideal constitution, and to that extent ought not to be the mean even if there were one.

"Aristotle's Two Complementary Views of the Polis" reviews the usual questions about whether the polis is thought of by Aristotle primarily as the whole community needed for living a properly human life or as the subset of that community that rules and thereby gives the city its particular structure and identity. But the essay focuses on asking about how Aristotle's view, or views, of the polis has shaped modern historians' understanding of the Greek polis. If modern historians are confused about how the Greeks saw the polis, Hansen finds them having no excuse since he argues that the Politics is only one example of easy and unconfused moving between the polis taken as the society composed of all the inhabitants of a place and the polis taken as the political community composed of the adult male citizens. I mentioned above Hansen's suggestion that Aristotle is responsible for a tendency among historians to think federations of cities were a later development than they in fact were. Hansen also blames Aristotle, and here the blame is moral as well as causal, for the belief that the polis was a distinctively Greek phenomenon. This requires reading the infamous claim in VII,7 that only Greeks seem to have the combination of intellect and spirit required for virtue as citizens as saying that only Greeks are truly human and so only Greeks are literally political or polis animals. This is arguably too strong. The remark is made in a context in which Aristotle is describing ideal conditions. He only needs to say -- and it's bad enough to have said -- that Greeks are the best humans. He doesn't need to say that they are the only humans. If Aristotle is indeed the only source for the belief that the polis was a uniquely Greek arrangement, then this seems as likely as not to be a misreading of Aristotle.

The cleanest and most persuasive chapter, to my mind, is the penultimate one: "Democratic Freedom and the Concept of Freedom in Plato and Aristotle". Hansen carefully canvasses the uses of eleutheria in the classical period. It functioned as the defining characteristic of democracies, understood as allowing ruling and being ruled in turn, that is, equality of power and authority, and in allowing the opportunity to live as one liked, that is, unlike a slave. Notoriously, neither Plato nor Aristotle was a fan. There is a perennial temptation to try to mute this sad fact, particularly in Aristotle's case, where there seems more room for hope. Hansen resists this by holding Aristotle's text firmly in view. There is no way to attribute to Aristotle a sympathy with the importance of freedom as it was understood by ancient defenders of democracy. Hansen does an admirable job of then simply showing that that is really all Aristotle has to say about freedom. The democrats are wrong. They don't misunderstand freedom; they misunderstand the good. Hansen might have added that it is the need for justice, rather than freedom, that shapes the discussion of the political good in Plato and Aristotle.