Reflections on Human Inquiry: Science, Philosophy and Common Life

Placeholder book cover

Nirmalangshu Mukherji, Reflections on Human Inquiry: Science, Philosophy and Common Life, Springer, 2017, 203pp., $119.99 (hbk), ISBN 9789811053634.

Reviewed by Nick Treanor, The University of Edinburgh


This book is not quite a monograph or a collection of essays, but it has the form of a monograph and is built out of individual essays, most of them previously published and under different titles. It is, the author tells us, an attempt to pull together and rework existing essays, supplemented by new ones, to speak to the theme given in its title. As Nirmalangshu Mukherji describes the project in the Acknowledgements:

Philosophical writing broadly divides into two modes: literary and scientific. These philosophical essays were written over the last two decades to explore the literary mode of our common lives as a counterpoint to the scientific mode that otherwise occupies my academic life. (vii)

Following the introduction there are eleven chapters, which are titled "Human Reality", "Science and the Mind", "Theories and Shifting Domains", "The Sceptic and the Cognitivist", "From Things to Needs", "Yearning for Consciousness", "Ascription of Knowledge", "Beliefs and Believers", "Varieties of Interpretation", "Literature and the Common Life", and "Education for the Species". Two are original to the book, the other nine have been previously published in some form.

The book is intended to mark the end of Mukherji's career (his expression). Mukherji recently retired from the University of Delhi where he spent the bulk of his career, following his PhD at the University of Waterloo in Canada in 1988. His first degree was in physics, 17 years earlier, and his intellectual interests reflect this breadth of background. Previous publications include The Cartesian Mind: Reflections on Language and Music (2000, Shimla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study) and The Primacy of Grammar (2010, MIT Press/Bradford). Mukherji has also published and worked in justice and human rights, largely from a political rather than narrowly philosophical angle.

Mukherji's book is marked by heterogeneity, with some of the essays being philosophy, some history or sociology, and some general thoughtful reflection, if you will. This approach befits the book's aim of addressing science, philosophy and the common life. The general theme is the nature of human inquiry, in its plurality of forms. In a compelling image in the Introduction, Mukherji sets out his vision for the collection:

Although they [the papers assembled in the collection] do cover familiar philosophical topics like knowledge, truth, realism, belief, meaning, interpretation and the like, which are often discussed in professional platforms, these topics carry much value beyond the closely guarded canons of the academia. After all, as the legend goes, many of these topics started their career on ancient streets or under banyan trees; arguably, unlike other branches of inquiry, they retain the memory of those plebeian assemblies. These chapters attempt to convey a sense of relaxed conversation in a disarming voice to reach audiences outside professional meetings of philosophers. As a result, they sometimes ignore, or even disobey, the formal tone and attire of academic discourse. (2)

This is a refreshing approach, in general but especially for a collection such as this. The heterogeneity mentioned earlier, however, does mean that at times the thread that unites the essays is not as bright as it could be, and less discerning or perceptive readers (such as this reviewer) may struggle to trace it.

The overtly philosophical chapters take on hard and familiar problems, including those of realism versus antirealism, the place of the mental in a scientific worldview, and the nature of consciousness, belief and knowledge. They are not the most interesting parts of the work, to my mind, although how fruitful readers find these chapters may depend on their familiarity with the topics. There are two ways in which the philosophical dimensions of the book are underwhelming.

First, there is less clarity and sophistication than ideal. Perhaps this is explained by the intention to speak to a broad audience. And some unclarity is also inevitable in a work like this, given its ambitions, and that can indeed be a virtue rather than a defect. If we restrict ourselves to what we can say exactly, much that should be said would not be, just as a farmer who insisted that furrows be perfectly formed would refuse to plough the hardest ground. That said, at times the essays eschew clarity that would be easily won and which seems essential. For example, in "Human Reality", the first substantial chapter after the introduction and written specifically for this book, Mukherji writes:

what do we mean when we say that nonhuman organisms conceive of other kinds of world? If we cannot ourselves conceive of any other kind of world except what we are allowed by our design, how can we make a comment on what different-designed animals conceive of? As Chomsky suggests, Nagel's question, "What is it like to be a bat?", does not seem to have an answer; hence, the question could be meaningless. (17)

I found this passage puzzling, and puzzling because it was just unclear to me what was being said. Take the last sentence: What does Mukherji (or Chomsky, for that matter) mean in saying that Nagel's question doesn't seem to have an answer? Is it that the question seems to have no answer at all? Or no answer that humans can understand? Is the idea Mukherji is driving at that the question doesn't have an answer, understood as a kind of semantic item akin to a sentence or proposition? Or is it rather that there is nothing it is like to be a bat, propositional or otherwise? These all seem different to me, at least on the face of it, and I am left wondering what point Mukherji wishes to make. One can also wonder about the alleged relation between having an answer and being meaningless. It sounds like Mukherji thinks that if a question has no answer then it is meaningless (I take the 'seems to' to cancel out the 'could be', such that if it seems to have no answer then it could be meaningless and if it does in fact have no answer then it is in fact meaningless -- although there again the reader is left to her own devices). But to say the question has no answer is, on the face of it, to take it not to be meaningless, just unanswerable even in principle. If something is meaningless, one might think, then it is not a question at all (any more than it is a command or a plea or an assertion, etc.). Or, finally, consider the second sentence of the passage, which asks how we could comment on what differently designed animals conceive of if we can't conceive of any kind of world except that afforded by our cognitive design. The suggestion (unargued for, but rhetorically asserted) seems to be that we can't comment, where the idea isn't that we can't say what other, differently-designed animals conceive, but that somehow we can't even make sense of the idea that they conceive differently. More needs to be said here -- it's just not clear to me what is being claimed, let alone what reasons stand in favour of it.

I may seem to belabour the point, but I hope only to convey how this sort of profusion of questions can arise too easily and interfere with the reader's ability to benefit from the discussion as much as Mukherji intends.

The second criticism I have of the overtly philosophical parts of the book concerns what I take to be insufficient engagement with relevant philosophical work. The "Human Reality" chapter and its treatment of the issues raised in Nagel's bat argument, just discussed, is an example of this. That argument was published 45 years ago, and much has been done to map and explore the landscape of the problem, but this does not come through in Mukherji's discussion of the argument. If one reviews the works cited in the book, there is little that is post-1992, even though all the essays have been written since 2000. I emphasise that the concern here is not with citation, but with whether the philosophical treatment of the issues would be stronger if it reflected greater engagement with people who are working on the same problems that concern Mukherji.

Where there is discussion or mention of other philosophers, it is sometimes not clear what purpose this is meant to serve, as, for example, in the following passage from Chapter 7:

The study of the thinking, sentient human subject has always been a central concern in philosophy in any tradition. However, only with the Cartesian rationalist tradition did the concern directly relate to the concept of mind as a separate substance, an additional joint in nature. As the Cartesian tradition of substance dualism lost its appeal in subsequent centuries due to serious challenges to the idea of a separate substance by empiricists like David Hume and John Locke, the discussion of mind itself, as a substantive concept, was progressively abandoned. In contemporary times, the situation for the Cartesian tradition worsened even further after Gilbert Ryle's influential critique of the concept of mind as the ghost in the machine. (98)

The chapter goes on to mention Kant, Searle, McGinn, Stich, Dennett, Bennet and Hacker, Churchland, Nagel, Chalmers, and Block, then reflects:

Humans seem to be condemned to entertain the concept of consciousness as part of their cognitive design, very much like they are condemned to entertain the concept of an (external) reality. That's all I have to say for now on this elusive topic; I am aware that it is difficult to say something definite on the metaphysical aspect of phenomenal consciousness. (107)

The reader is taken on a whirlwind potted history of the topic, but it's not clear why or what has been gained at the end of it.

The best chapters, in my view, are the ones that are or include discussions that are broadly sociological or historical. These include Chapter 6 ("From Things to Needs", originally published as "Academic philosophy in India", which offers Mukherji's perspective on how and why Western analytic philosophy came to dominate in India; Chapter 8 ("Ascription of Knowledge", originally published as "Traditions and the concept of knowledge"), which focuses on the development of philosophy and science in India; and the final chapter ("Education for the Species", published the previous year under the same title) which focuses on the relation between education and human extinction. There is some interesting philosophical work in these chapters, especially Chapter 8, which outlines a view of knowledge similar to the view Edward Craig develops in Knowledge and the State of Nature (Oxford, 1991). I am not qualified to comment in a meaningful way on what I have described as the sociological or historical issues, but Mukherji's discussion of these is interesting and enriching, and the chapter on education and extinction raises important questions about the trajectory of our species and the place of 'enlightenment knowledge' in hastening its demise.

In the acknowledgements, Mukherji thanks his close friend Bijoy Boruah and says "I particularly remember a long drive on the highways to the Himalayas, engrossed in the problem of whether our modes of knowledge cloud our conception of reality. Unsurprisingly, we lost our way and ended up in a different province." This would be a fitting description of the book as a whole. It's a long drive, with spectacular mountains in view, but at the end of the book I'm not sure where we are. Readers interested in the book are encouraged to read Mukherji's introduction, as it sympathetically presents and describes what he is doing in the book. It may be that as a reviewer I have failed to take the right stance towards the philosophical aspects of the book and so have benefited from it less than I should have.