Reflections on Meaning

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Paul Horwich, Reflections on Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2005, 236pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199251258.

Reviewed by David Macarthur, The University of Sydney


This lucid, closely argued, and stimulating book offers Horwich's latest formulation and defence of his Use Theory of Meaning (UTM) -- a version of what is commonly called conceptual role semantics -- in light of objections provoked by earlier presentations of it, especially his Meaning (1998). All but one of its chapters have appeared previously, although their contents have been modified and revised, in some cases substantially, for the current publication. Chapter 1 provides a brief overview of the philosophical issues that bear on the question of what linguistic meaning is. The second chapter is devoted to the important task of presenting the UTM. Chapter 3 argues against imposing a certain explanatory requirement on reductive accounts of meaning. Chapters 4 and 5 deal, respectively, with the nature of vagueness and the normativity of meaning. The sixth chapter examines the relationship between the rules that constitute word-meaning and epistemic rationality. The penultimate chapter concerns how UTM looks from the perspective of Chomskian psycho-linguistics. And the last chapter focuses on the issue of compositionality. 

Despite being inspired by Wittgenstein's famous reminder that meaning is use, UTM is intended to show something far stronger and more controversial than that suggests, namely, how literal semantic meaning is explained in terms of a purely naturalistic conception of use as (roughly) the disposition to accept various marks and noises or their mentalese correlates. The theory, as Horwich puts it, shows "how semantic phenomena arise within a fundamentally non-semantic world" (27). In Horwich's conception, then, 'use' must be described in non-semantic, non-intentional vocabulary. Word-types are, in the first instance, understood and identified in terms of physical sounds or shapes. Horwich wants to explain how words, so understood, come to have what he calls meaning-properties. The result is a naturalistic reduction of the literal semantic meaning-properties of word-types to (scientifically respectable) 'use' in terms of the acceptance or rejection of sentences containing the word. More fully, the meaning of word w is explained in terms of an (idealized) 'law of use' for w of the following form: "that such-and-such w-sentences are regularly accepted in such-and-such circumstances" (28). The proposal may be represented as follows,

The ink mark, bachelor, has its literal semantic meaning in virtue of the fact that its basic regularity of use is our acceptance of the mark, noise or mental symbol, "The bachelors are the unmarried men."

That is, certain basic meaning-constituting uses of a word are supposed to explain all of its uses.   

The account that emerges is: a) non-sceptical in so far as it admits that meaning-properties are genuine and discoverable facts (in a deflationary sense of 'fact'), b) reductive in holding that meaning-properties can be reduced to, or analysed in terms of non-semantic, non-intentional, use-properties, c) applicable to both overt and mental languages, d) focused in the first instance on word-meaning, e) not fundamentally normative, f) applicable to both communal languages and idiolects, g) internalist, and h) deflationist in the sense that meanings are not explained in terms of truth-conditions or reference relations (cf. 19).

Schematically, UTM is a contribution to the metaphysical question of the nature or essence of meaning rather than a substantial account of how the meanings of complex expressions are constructed from the meanings of their parts. Furthermore, given Horwich's allegiance to a Quinean naturalism that does not care to draw any substantial distinction between philosophy and science, UTM is conceived as providing the basic framework for a scientific linguistics, one that will in principle yield causal explanations of linguistic activity. Thus, to call UTM a deflationary account of meaning, as Horwich often does, is seriously misleading: it is true that unlike many other contemporary theories of meaning, it is compatible with a deflationary view of truth and reference. But this no more makes it a deflationary theory of meaning than the fact that Newton's theory of gravity is compatible with a deflationary view of truth makes it a deflationary theory of gravity.  (Horwich, of course, is the last person entitled to object to this analogy on the grounds that meaning has more to do with truth than with gravity.) On the contrary, Horwich's theory is thoroughly inflationary, qua theory of meaning, since it is a naturalistic reduction of substantial meaning-properties with serious causal-explanatory ambitions. 

Of the many topics that deserve critical attention let me discuss only four:

1) Horwich's metaphilosophy.

One of the attractive features of the book is the way it demonstrates in practice the fruitfulness of a Wittgensteinian approach to the philosophical treatment of meaning. On this anti-theoretic or quietist treatment, the philosophical problems surrounding meaning are understood as confusions or misconceptions (about how we can or must use words) rather than topics for which there might be a legitimate theoretical response. In this spirit, much of Horwich's development of UTM depends on criticizing, qualifying or weakening the constraints that philosophers of language have tended to impose on a philosophical theory of meaning. For example, Horwich trivializes (or "deflates") the compositionality principle by accepting "that the meaning of a complex is determined by the meanings of its parts and by how those parts are combined" (202) whilst denying that this requires thinking there is any general story to tell about how this is determined or why the principle holds.

One might, nonetheless, think there is a prima facie tension between endorsing Wittgensteinian quietism as philosophical methodology and at the same time offering a philosophical theory of meaning, even if it is inspired by Wittgenstein's own writings. As I understand it, Horwich finesses this issue by conceiving of his theory as a scientific theory of meaning rather than a distinctively philosophical one. The philosophical content of UTM is supposed to be largely deflationary, a matter of clearing up confusions and misunderstandings rather than producing new facts: e.g., pointing out the hopelessness of explaining meanings in terms of substantial notions of truth and reference; deflating the compositionality principle; and so on. Wittgenstein's injunction against philosophical theorizing is respected by combining philosophical deflationism with scientific inflationism.

But the problem with this is that Horwich's reductive account of meaning is, despite his intentions, a substantial philosophical theory for at least three reasons. Firstly, Horwich takes the primary things that have meaning-properties to be physical objects rather than semantic items like ordinary expressions in a natural language. Given its reductive ambitions, UTM concerns the use not of the English word "bachelor" but the tokens of a physically conceived word-type sharing either a sonic profile or graphic similarities to the ink mark, bachelor. But to say that language is fundamentally a matter of physical objects is a highly metaphysical claim on a par with saying that persons are fundamentally physical objects (i.e. bodies) and, far from dissolving the problem of intentionality (as claimed previously: see (1998, p103)), it leaves it as pressing as ever.[1] Secondly, one of Wittgenstein's main themes is that use is a complex motley whereas Horwich holds the controversial thesis that some specified uses of a word are privileged meaning-constituting uses capable of explaining all of the word's other uses. The third reason for thinking of UTM as a substantial philosophical theory is that Horwich supposes there to be something called literal semantic meaning which is amenable to theoretical inquiry quite apart from a host of other notions of meaning including speaker's meaning and pragmatic meaning. Although this is a common assumption in contemporary philosophy of language, it is a view thoroughly rejected by Wittgenstein amongst others (e.g. Austin). Let us consider this last point further.

2) Pragmatics. 

In criticizing theories of meaning based on thick notions of truth and reference, Horwich is a non-traditionalist, but this impression is tempered when one considers his commitment to a very traditional conception of there being a sharp separation of semantics and pragmatics such that "each predicate has a context-independent, 'default', literal, reference-fixing meaning" (60). This is surprising if for no other reason than that one of Wittgenstein's central lessons is the inextricable entanglement of semantics with such pragmatic factors as: Who is speaking? To whom? With what interests or purposes? And on what occasion?  (see, e.g. Philosophical Investigations (1953) #117, #296, #349, #525). As Charles Travis has convincingly argued in a number of publications, including Unshadowed Thoughts (2000), Wittgenstein opposes the idea that there is any context-independent way of characterizing the truth-conditions of sentences of a natural language. His main reason is that sentences are radically occasion-sensitive, admitting of indefinitely many reasonable alternative understandings that are not foreclosed by the standard dictionary meanings of words. On this picture, pragmatic factors are needed to determine a suitable understanding of a sentence on a given occasion, and so, an associated truth-condition. Different understandings yield different truth-conditions. Horwich rejects this kind of interpenetration of semantics and pragmatics on the grounds that the meanings of a language of thought (which he simply takes for granted) would have to be fixed context-independently. But one not already committed to the hypothesis of a language of thought will find this reasoning unpersuasive. If there is no such thing as an innate context-insensitive semantics then there is no such thing as a language of thought that requires it.

3) The Normativity of Truth and Meaning.

Meaning is a normative notion. To make a claim about what a word means is to say how it ought to be used. But is meaning constitutionally normative or is it ultimately explicable in non-normative terms? Horwich opposes a significant current in modern philosophy by opting for the second of these alternatives. He begins by claiming that the norms of both truth and meaning are expressible in the following principles:

(T) It is desirable (i.e. our aim ought to be) to believe only what is true.


(M) If a sentence means that dogs bark, then it is desirable to accept it only if dogs bark; and if a sentence means that killing is wrong then it is desirable to accept it only if killing is wrong, … , and so on. (108)

His primary move is to suppose that the normative import of truth and meaning is analogous to that of moral norms such as courage and perseverance. The thought is that just as it is the social utility of these traits that explains their normative status so, too, with truth and meaning. The basic form of the account is this:

(X) If one desires social utility then one ought to accept (T) and (M).  

Here the prescriptive force of truth and meaning are conditional on one's desires. But this putative explanation of normativity presupposes that one both believes and understands (X), and that inevitably raises the question whether it is true and whether one understands it correctly. Far from explaining the norms of truth and meaning in non-normative terms, these norms are ineliminably presupposed in the very idea of an agent with beliefs and desires. Moreover, (X) misleadingly suggests that beliefs are under ordinary voluntary control. But forming a belief is not an action like crossing the street, which we can do at will. To come to believe that it is raining, for instance, is to accept that that is how things are independently of oneself and one's attitudes, including this belief itself. Belief may 'aim at the truth', as we say, but this is not to be understood as a directive to form beliefs that conform to the requirements of truth as if that were a matter of contingent choice. 'Aiming at the truth' is a way of describing the conceptual connection between belief and truth: it is an internal feature of beliefs that they are assessable in terms of truth. Similarly, one does not desire to accept a sentence, u, that means that p, only if p. For the most part, correctly understanding the meanings of the sentences of one's own language is a precondition of being understandable as a rational agent with propositional attitudes at all.

4) The Form of a Use Theory.

Horwich claims that his version of UTM takes the reductive form of a naturalistic analysis because of its explanatory advantages: "what motivates the search for a theory like UTM is that it promises certain explanatory advantages over wholly non-reductionist accounts" (36; see also 18-19). Use-properties of words are supposed to explain the circumstances in which we accept all of the sentences containing them. Horwich provides very few examples of the basic meaning-constituting uses of actual words and those he does provide do not seem to deliver the promised explanations. Consider this example:

"red"'s meaning stems from the fact that its law of use is a propensity to accept "That is red" in response to the sort of visual experience normally provoked by observing a clearly red surface. (26)

Even adding facts about the context or the speaker's intentions, it is hard to see how this 'law of use' can explain ordinary usage such as calling an object in the dark red, or saying "That is red" of a stolen car whose original red has been repainted green, or applying the term 'red' to ink that looks black in the bottle; and so on. Such examples lead one to wonder whether anything counts as a 'core explanatory use,' especially in light of Quine's arguments against there being a sharp boundary between meaning and collateral information.

Horwich also gives the impression that non-reductive versions of UTM must inevitably leave meaning looking mysterious. But this seems to be a product of his initial demand for an answer to the metaphysical question "What is meaning?" where what is required is a non-circular account of meaning in "a fundamentally material world" (36). Yet a genuinely deflationary approach to meaning would not try to answer but, rather, would attempt to challenge, this very question -- a move Horwich himself endorses in other cases, e.g. truth. Notoriously, Wittgenstein provides an example of this approach: "What we do is to bring words back from their metaphysical to their everyday use" (PI #116). Leaving the metaphysical question about the nature or essence of meaning aside, Wittgenstein enjoins us instead to reflect on what use the term 'meaning' has in our lives, exploring what we -- a problematical 1st-person plural 'we' -- call, or count as, the same meaning, an explanation of meaning, a lack of meaning, etc, in different cases. In Wittgenstein's hands the use 'theory' is really not a theory at all but a reminder of what we unreflectively seem to know about how to use the word "meaning". Another example is provided by Huw Price's functionalist account of use, which starts from an anthropological stance towards linguistic practice from which one raises a reflective question about the function or role of semantic vocabulary (including our talk about meaning) within the practice. Although these are both examples of non-reductive approaches to meaning, in neither case is there an appeal to anything supernatural or mysterious. They are two genuinely naturalistic approaches to meaning that wisely distance themselves from the metaphysical project to "naturalize" meanings that is associated with orthodox, narrowly scientific naturalism.

In this review I have taken a selective and somewhat aerial view of Horwich's project, but there is a great deal of interesting and nuanced argument on almost every page of this thought-provoking book, including detailed responses to important semantic theorists such as Chomsky, Davidson, Dummett, Fodor, Grice, Kripke, Putnam, and Quine.  For anyone interested in the prospects for a use-based theory of meaning, or a naturalistic reduction of semantics, or who wants a clear sense of current issues at the cutting-edge of philosophy of language, Horwich's book is required reading.


[1] For further development of this criticism see Huw Price, "What Should a Deflationist about Truth say about Meaning?," Villanueva, E. (ed.), Truth (Philosophical Issues, Vol. 8), Ridgeview, 1997, p 113.