Reflections on the Liar

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Bradley Armour-Garb (ed.), Reflections on the Liar, Oxford University Press, 2017, 383pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199896042.

Reviewed by Wen-fang Wang, National Yang Ming University


This book collects thirteen papers (not including the editor's introduction) written by seventeen philosophers who have done excellent work in philosophy in the past yet have said very little, if anything, about the liar paradox in particular or about the semantic paradoxes in general. As the editor says in the introduction, in recent years there has already been a number of books that focus on offering or critically evaluating various formal treatments of the semantic paradoxes, and the purpose of this volume is to change the landscape a bit by offering these philosophers an opportunity to give what might be descried as philosophical reflections on the topic.

The editor does a good job in his introduction both in giving a comprehensive overview of various existing projects -- diagnostic, treatment, descriptive, and characterization projects -- regarding the semantic paradoxes and in summarizing the other chapters. As a result, the introduction is very useful for readers eager to learn from the book. However, due to the variety of concerns and angles -- metaphysical, epistemological, logical, linguistic, methodological, and experimental -- of the thirteen papers, it is very difficult to classify them in any natural way into a few groups and then make general comments about the papers in each group. Instead, in what follows, I will divide the papers into two categories, those that I like and those that I dislike, and review them one by one.

Five of the thirteen papers are really worth reading. Among them, I highly recommend Susanne Bobzien's lengthy "Gestalt Shifts in the Liar -- or Why KT4M Is the Logic of Semantic Modalities," which is innovative, inspiring, and well thought out. Bobzien carefully analyzes three features of a liar sentence and shows how their combination leads to its paradoxicality: salience-based bistability (which is due to its self-ascription), context sensitivity (which is due to its truth-value ascription), and assessment sensitivity (which is due to its self-ascription of a semantic value that is at odds with truth). A neat comparison between the liar and the duck-rabbit illusion (or any perceptual multistability) is then at hand: just as the puzzling nature of the duck-rabbit illusion is due to mutually incompatible but equally impeccable gestalt shifts, so the paradoxical nature of the liar is due to mutually incompatible but equally justifiable and irrefutable assessment viewpoints.

As a result, Bobzien claims that it is impossible to determine the truth value tout court of a liar sentence and that the appropriate epistemic attitude toward a liar sentence should be absolute agnosticism: we should simply suspend judgment regarding the truth status of a liar sentence. After distilling these features of a liar sentence and separating a "pragmatic" feature (i.e., bistability) from the rest, Bobzien goes on to propose a normal modal logic KT4M for the truth-tout-court (or truth-regardless) operator of a natural language, which is, nevertheless, intended to "capture equally the operator use and the predicate use in natural language discourse." Bobzien shows that KT4M is classical and coherent, that her proposed solution to the liar paradox is revenge-free, and that one direction of the T-schema is undecidable in KT4M. Finally, she argues that, in view of KT4M, bivalence (which is not equivalent to LEM in KT4M) is the content of truth and that the notions of both truth and bivalence are semideterminable. In my view, Bobzien's whole picture and sophisticated arguments are all very plausible and admirable. To be sure, some of the points she argues, especially that bistability is only a pragmatic feature of a liar sentence that is not supposed to be represented by a formal semantics, will appear implausible to some people. But I am inclined to think that all researchers who work on the semantic paradoxes should read this paper.

I also highly recommend Gila Sher's "Truth and Transcendence: Turning the Tables on the Liar Paradox" for the novel angle it offers on the solution of the semantic paradoxes. Sher boldly proposes a substantial thesis about truth, the IMMANENCE thesis, and endeavors to show how it solves the semantic paradoxes. Roughly, IMMANENCE is the claim that, in order for truth to emerge as a standard for human thoughts, three things are required: (i) a genuine immanent thought about the world, (ii) a transcendent thought about the immanent thought in (i), and (iii) a normative evaluation as to whether the world matches what the thought in (i) says. She argues that one consequence of IMMANENCE is that, in order for the T-schema to apply to a truth-ascribing thought p, p has to be a bona fide immanent sentence and the truth predicate in p must in a natural sense "transcend" the truth predicate (if any) in its target thought. Because liar sentences arguably violate this last requirement, the T-schema should not be applied to them and the liar paradox generated by applying the T-schema to a liar sentence cannot arise. Sher's view is serious and interesting, and I think that most people who have thought about the semantic paradoxes would stand by her side on this particular issue. However, things are not so easy more generally, and I doubt that her solution can be extended to Grelling's paradox, which does not involve a transcendent thought that attributes the property of being true to an immanent thought. It would be nice to see how Sher would respond to this issue.

Ian Rumfitt's "The Liar without Truth" is highly recommended for its clear analytical style and for the provocative ideas that it offers. Rumfitt takes a suggestion from Prior and Williamson and proposes that we first develop Aristotle's conception of truth, not by means of the T-scheme, but instead in the following way:

Ac(True(A, c)↔ ∃P(Say(A, c, P) ∧ P).

In this way, we can solve the liar paradox by rejecting, via a proof, the assumption that a self-referential token of the liar sentence expresses a proposition. The claimed proof, however, seems to lead to the well-known revenge problem: if the liar token does not express a proposition, it seems to follow that it is not true -- but this is exactly what the token says about itself. How then can the first token of the liar fail to express a proposition, while the second token succeeds? In response to this question, Rumfitt rejects the contextualist solutions proposed by Parsons and Glanzberg, and instead adopts Mackie's suggestion and claims that, as a matter of fact, both liar tokens express no proposition. The most interesting, though brief, part of the paper is where Rumfitt applies, with a minor revision, his calculus for signed formulae developed elsewhere to diagnose where the mistake arises in the inference from the rejection of the liar as expressing a proposition to the conclusion that another token of the liar is true. The crucial element of this diagnosis is to distinguish expressing a falsehood from failing to express a truth and to distinguish accepting as false from rejecting as untrue. In my opinion, Rumfitt's diagnosis of the problem is, if not on the right track, at least worth further development and discussion.

I also recommend Cory Wright's "Pluralism and the Liar". Wright makes a few good distinctions within alethic pluralism. He rejects so-called "discourse pluralism" because, in his view, it is the wrong way to articulate the main idea of alethic pluralism and because it is liable to incur inconsistency and paradox. He goes on to propose that we understand alethic pluralism in terms of multiple truth-determining properties, which is compatible with there being a unique truth predicate. According to Wright's determination pluralism, each sector of discourse Di is regulated by a truth-determining property pi, the possession of which suffices to determine the truth value of a sentence s. One way for the determination pluralist to avoid the liar paradoxes is then to claim that the liar sentence λ, though meaningful, is not a member of any sector of discourse, or, as Wright puts it, it is undecidable. As a result, the determination pluralist can decline to give a truth-evaluation of λ i.e., can decline to assert that λ is true, or that it is false, or that it is either true or false, or that it is both true and false, or that it is neither true nor false. Wright's idea is very interesting but unfortunately only suggestive; he does not explore how the determination pluralist should justify the claim that the liar sentence is "undecidable" in his sense. As he himself admits, "this is only an exploratory start on such an approach; further work outlining the solution is required." I expect to see a further development of these ideas.

The final paper that I recommend, but not very strongly, is Bruno Whittle's "Truth, Hierarchy, and Incoherence." Whittle argues that most approaches to the semantic paradoxes face a dilemma: they either appeal to a hierarchy of truth predicates and languages, or contend that an apparently coherent concept, such as "exclusion negation," is in fact incoherent. Both horns of the dilemma result in expressive limitations. In order to escape from this dilemma and to avoid the expressive limitations, Whittle proposes that we take compositional rules of semantics as having exceptions. In this way, one can say that the liar sentence is false without being forced by the relevant compositional rule to conclude that it is therefore true. To prove that his idea really works, Whittle develops ideas presented in Haim Gaifman's pointer semantics to show how we can in fact give a rigorous and systematic development of the idea that compositional rules have exceptions. However, it turns out that such a development also allows exceptions to many intuitively valid inference patterns, such as Substitutivity of Identicals, Conjunction Introduction and Conjunction Elimination. I think that Whittle's idea is interesting, yet, due to the problem of allowing exceptions to intuitively valid inference patterns, I am not sure whether it deserves to be further developed or not. Moreover, Whittle's view seems to imply that, on pain of the dilemma, no language should allow its semantic rules to be exception-free, which is, in my opinion, quite a drastic response to the semantic paradoxes.

I personally didn't like eight of the thirteen papers. Some of them seem to me not to be closely related to the book's main theme. Some of them seem to me to be too sketchy and obscure to be evaluated. Some of them seem to me to be, from a methodological point of view, too naïve or too optimistic regarding the solution of the semantic paradoxes, or too commonsensical to reflect philosophers' profound wisdom on the topic. And, finally, some of them seem to me to put forward ideas which are so implausible that it would take a very strong argument to make even a prima facie case for them. However, I don't mean that none of them are worth reading. Most of them can still be very instructive and useful for other purposes. I will describe what these papers are about and give brief comments on them.

In "From No People to No Languages: A Nihilistic Response to the Liar Family of Semantic Paradoxes," Bradley Armour-Garb and Peter Unger argue that the same sort of reasoning that Unger has employed as a response to the sorites paradox can be deployed to arrive at the conclusion that there are no expressions and no languages at all, and to thereby resolve the semantic paradoxes. Though "effectively" resolving the semantic paradoxes by insisting, say, that there is actually no expression being referred to in Grelling's paradox and that there is no sentence such as the liar, this "resolution" to the semantic paradoxes is, in my opinion, too implausible to defend and lacks the sort of compelling arguments required for taking it seriously. Furthermore, since this response withholds both classical logic and those intuitively sound but controversial principles for semantic terms, I seriously doubt that it will impress anyone who works on this topic. At any rate, if there were, as they propose, no expressions and no languages at all, the whole history of the semantic paradoxes and the abundant literature on that topic (including their own paper) would be a miracle or an illusion.

In the two-page note "Toward Resolving the Liar Paradox," Gilbert Harman suggests that we explain the notion of truth for nonindexical sentences, not by the T-convention, which leads to contradiction, but by the following two principles that are arguably jointly consistent (where P default implies Q iff one is entitled to take P to imply Q (and therefore accept 'if P then Q') in the absence of reasons to think the implication doesn't hold):

(DT) 'σ is true' default implies and is default implied by σ.

(DA) All instance of DT in which σ is in both cases replaced by a nonindexical sentence of English are true.

Though Harman thinks that these two principles jointly explain "a nonarbitrary notion of truth", it is hard for me to be as sanguine as he is. For one thing, it is hard for me to see how to accommodate the epistemic notion of entitlement within a formal semantics. For another, if having a reason may change from person to person or from time to time, this way of explaining the notion of truth may make the notion of truth a relative one. Finally, in my opinion, a suitable explanation of the notion of truth should at least provide us with some clear principle or principles regarding when and how to apply the predicate 'is true' correctly; Harman's idea, however, is far from achieving this task.

In "Microlanguages, Vagueness, and Paradox," Peter Ludlow advocates the idea that human languages are dynamic, one-off fleeting things (which he calls "microlanguages") that we build on a conversation-by-conversation basis. As we shift from one microlanguage to another, different terms are introduced and retired and the meanings of terms are adjusted and modulated. There are, nonetheless, constraints on how such a shift should happen. In particular, one of the conditions, the so-called "S-admissibility condition," says that "no token u of a sentence S is admissible in a microlanguage L, unless discourse participants (tacitly) agree that u will be determinably either true or false." (p. 128.) As a result of the S-admissibility condition, a liar sentence is not a sentence of any human language (microlanguage) since it is ungrounded in the sense that there is no recognizable path to determine its truth or falsity. Ludlow also shows us how the idea of a microlanguage offers us a solution to the sorites paradox. I am sympathetic with Ludlow's dynamic picture of human languages and think that this picture may provide an interesting view of the sorites paradox. However, Ludlow's proposed resolution of the liar paradox, namely, that liar sentences are not sentences of any human language at all, seems to me (and perhaps to many other people working on the semantic paradoxes) to be quite implausible. More specifically, by excluding three-valued solutions, the postulation of the S-admissibility condition certainly begs the question of what the fundamental problem of the semantic paradoxes consists in.

In "Semantic Paradoxes and Abductive Methodology," Timothy Williamson argues from a methodological point of view for solutions that keep classical logic intact. Williamson proposes that we compare different logics by taking a well-confirmed theory T (say, mathematics), comparing the consequences of T that are "logical" according to these different logics, and adjudicating these logics according to normal scientific standards of the abductive methodology. These standards include fit with the evidence (which in turn includes consistency and non-triviality), strength (either in the normal, logical sense or in the loose sense of being more specific or more informative), simplicity, non-ad-hocness, elegance, and unifying power. Williamson optimistically believes that, once we assess different logics abductively, it will become clear that classical logic has a head start on its rivals, especially in terms of simplicity and strength. He further believes that, when we apply the abductive methodology to adjudicate solutions of the semantic paradoxes, solutions that restrict classical logic but keep the T-schema intact will look dubious. When combined with a well-confirmed theory like mathematics, these solutions will suffer from a great loss of strength because of the restrictions put on some classical principles. On the other hand, Williamson says, if the non-classical solutions of the semantic paradoxes attempt to recover the lost strength by assuming that classical logic is at least locally valid in a well-confirmed theory, this assumption will tend to reduce its explanatory eloquence because of its ad-hocness. I do think that Williamson's argument for the abductive advantage of classical solutions over non-classical solutions of the semantic paradoxes is a nice try. However, I doubt that his optimistic evaluation of the abductive advantages of classical logic will persuade any non-believers in classical logic.

In "Thinking about the Liar, Fast and Slow," Robert Barnard, Joseph Ulatowski, and Jonathan M. Weinberg summarize and analyze a few results of their experiment, in which they recruited 236 total participants online and through Amazon Mechanical-Turk, investigating the psychological underpinnings of the liar paradox. They claim that their experiment is motivated by several speculations previously made by philosophers about how people might think about the liar sentence. They also claim that the results of their experiment not only could reveal how ordinary folks actually think about the liar but might also tell us how we should think about it. In particular, they draw the following two conclusions. First, our quick and associative evaluations of the liar sentence tend to be mostly "false," while our more reflective responses, especially those aided by some philosophical training, generally lead people to endorse a "neither true nor false" response. Second, "since greater reflection or expertise leads to an increased tendency toward the 'neither' answer, that is legitimately some reason to think that that response is more likely to be the correct one." (p. 65.) I, however, think that the motivation of the experiment is somewhat confused and that the data are philosophically less significant than the authors suggest. The result of the experiment certainly will not persuade those who have dealt with the semantic paradoxes in a non-gappist way to change their minds. In my opinion, their experiment may have provided a very good psychological reflection on the semantic paradoxes, but it hardly constitutes a "philosophical" reflection.

In "Revising Inconsistent Concepts," Kevin Scharp and Stewart Shapiro investigate the question of when it is reasonable to replace an inconsistent concept, such as the concept truth. According to them, being inconsistent on its own does not signal the need for a replacement; the concept needs to be replaced only when its inconsistency paralyzes valuable projects. The other supposedly consistent concept or concepts that replace the inconsistent one are supposed to take over the original explanatory role of the inconsistent concept. But Scharp and Shapiro do not discuss how to evaluate the extent to which various proposals for such a replacement are successful. Instead, they simply conclude that, while the deflationists may have little reason to replace the concept of truth as long as they stick to the claim that truth should play no explanatory role whatsoever, the inflationists who propose a truth-conditional semantics might want to replace the concept of truth if they want a semantics for the entirety of a sufficiently rich enough natural language. All they have claimed in this paper seems to me to be just commonsense. In addition, because of their assumption that truth is an inconsistent concept in the sense that its constituting principles, the T-schema (or T-in plus T-out inferential rules), is inconsistent (either in itself or with otherwise uncontroversial facts), their paper will be less interesting to those people who firmly believe that the main culprit in the semantic paradoxes is the underlying classical logic rather than the concept of truth.

In "I-Languages and T-Sentences," Paul M. Pietroski offers several undermining reasons against the program of developing a theory of truth-conditions for a human language and against the Davidsonian program of using such a theory of truth-conditions as the core of a theory of meaning for a human language. Pietroski's negative reasons are various and persuasive (including, e.g., that these programs may have presupposed an erroneous picture about human languages or what he calls "I-languages"; that sentence-types are not, while utterances and judgments are, truth-evaluable; that there exist non-declarative sentences; Foster's Problem; and so on). Yet it seems to me that most of these reasons can be stated without involving the semantic paradoxes. The main and the only connection between the semantic paradoxes and the two above-mentioned programs that I have found in Pietroski's paper is simply this: a theory of truth-conditions for a human language that has a T-equivalence for a liar sentence (True("Linus is not true") ≡ ~True(Linus); where "Linus" is a name of "Linus is not true") as a theorem will have an obviously false theorem. And the reason why the T-equivalence for a liar sentence is obviously false is that, according to Pietroski's intuition, "Linus is not true" is neither true nor false while "~True(Linus)" is true. In my opinion Pietroski's claims both that the T-equivalence is false and that "Linus is not true" is neither true nor false are controversial enough that they need to be suitably justified. However, this does not seem to be Pietroski's concern at all in this lengthy paper.

In "Semantics for Semantics," James R. Shaw argues that compositional theories (of what he calls the "truth-extensionalism" sort) that assign the predicate "true" an extension (perhaps with an extra anti-extension) relative to a context-index pair are inadequate. They are inadequate because they fail to explain, in a way that is consistent with the fact of linguistic productivity, relatively stable truth-value judgments concerning two kinds of semantic circularities. The first kind (so-called "defaulters") involves claims like "Everything I say today will be true," uttered when all other utterances by the speaker on that day are true. The second kind involves general claims such as "Some disjunction which is not true is such that all of its disjuncts are true." Both kinds of claims are such that (i) speakers have concurrent and correct judgements about their truth status ("true" in the first example and "false" in the second) through normal compositional means, and (ii) these claims could have a different truth status in a language L which differs from ours only in adopting a different convention regarding "true".

Shaw argues that, due to these two features of these claims (i and ii) and to the fact that truth-extensionalism only assigns an extension to "true" relative to a context-index pair, truth-extensionalism fails to explain the discrepancy between normal speakers' evaluations of these claims and the possibility of their being evaluated differently by merely changing the convention regarding "true". Shaw goes on to argue briefly that an adequate compositional semantics (of what he calls the "truth-proceduralism" sort) for a natural language should contain a procedural element in order to overcome the problem. Everything Shaw says in the paper could be right (though I have some reservations about some of what he says). But it should be noted first that many of his claims are based on controversial premises. Worse, all of the examples of semantic circularities that he gives in the paper are examples of benign reflexivity; none of them really has anything to do with liar-like (or even truth-teller-like) sentences. Though Shaw tries to draw some implications of his view for the liar paradox in the final short section of the paper, the comments there are too sketchy and suggestive to be evaluated seriously. I therefore fail to see a tight connection between Shaw's discussions and the main theme of the book: the liar paradox and the semantic paradoxes more generally.


I want to thank especially a young colleague from mainland China: Professor Hongguang Wang from Huaqiao University, Fujian Province. Over the past months, the two of us have read through the whole book and have had a wonderful discussion. I also want to thank my colleague Jonathon Hricko for suggesting several nice ideas to improve this review. Still, I am responsible for all the mistakes and comments contained in the review.